Unprincipled Virtue

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Arpaly, Nomy, Unprincipled Virtue, Oxford, 2003, 216pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195152042.

Reviewed by Julia Driver , Dartmouth College


I felt sure I would like Nomy Arpaly’s book when I opened it to the first page and saw John LeCarré’s name in the first sentence. I was not disappointed. Arpaly uses an engaging mix of literary examples and rigorous analysis to present and argue for a variety of interesting claims relating to virtue. Arpaly has something novel and interesting to say about autonomy, agency, moral worth, and virtue. This is an excellent book, and one of the best I’ve read recently.

Arpaly believes (and I agree) that moral theory has all too often been concerned with discussions of unreal agents; ones who are either positive or negative moral exemplars. Thus, the fuzzy middle cases tend to be avoided. Yet, she argues, these are the cases that have much to show us about moral worth in the real world.

Let’s consider first the LeCarré example she uses, that of Oliver Single, who makes a momentous decision to side with the legal system and against his own father, and who makes this decision in a kind of mental haze. One can see that when it comes to momentous decisions, surely, people are often not the clear-headed rational paragons discussed in most of the philosophy literature. They are complicated, fuzzy, and while responsive to reasons not always clearly aware of the very reasons they seem to respond to in their actions. This sort of case is dear to my heart, since I have long held that virtue ethics in particular sets the bar way too high when it comes to criteria for moral virtue.1 Good people often don’t have a clear understanding of their own motivations and the reasons that drive them. This is a theme that Arpaly deftly takes up in her own work, though she is focusing on the issue of autonomy and moral worth. Her account of moral worth offers, in one respect, an improvement over other accounts in the past – mainly focusing on virtue, again – which sought to account for similar sorts of cases. For example, in my account I try to argue that characters like Huckleberry Finn are virtuous, yes – and I give a consequentialist account of character traits to account for this. Arpaly, however, avoids the tangled debate over which account of moral evaluation is correct. Instead, she focuses on the more basic reason for why someone like Huck is praiseworthy: he is responsive to the right sort of moral reasons. And this is what counts, even though he cannot correctly represent those reasons as moral reasons, and he himself does not understand the nature of his actions. Her account is simple and elegant and captures the intuitive force behind the different cases without making contentious claims about the criteria for moral evaluation. Of course, that’s not to say she doesn’t make other contentious claims.

Let’s look at her claims about moral worth. Her main project is to come up with an account of ’praise’ and ’blame’ that is not autonomy based. One of the things she would like to do is give an account of why in some cases ignorance does not make one morally blameworthy, whereas in other cases it does. What is the relevant difference between the cases? On her view it is the quality of the will and the motivation. Is the person’s heart in the right place, is she responsive to the right sorts of reasons, is her action ’authentic’? If the person satisfies these criteria, she is praiseworthy. Consider again the case of Huckleberry Finn, a case well discussed in the virtue literature.2 Huckleberry is naïve and utterly mistaken about what is morally right – he helps a friend escape slavery, and actually feels guilty about it. Yet, in the end he does the right thing. The diagnosis of this case for Arpaly is that in spite of what he consciously believes, Huck is nevertheless responsive to the right sorts of reasons. I suspect that one reason we think well of Huckleberry Finn is that we do think that, transplanted to 21 st Century America, he would not have the ignorant views he in fact had. His basic will is a good one. This is not true of the inveterate racist, whose will is such that he is really simply looking for an excuse to hate. It is these sorts of thoughts that affect our intuitions in these cases. But I’d like to add another one. We feel that, in light of these personality differences, one won’t see someone like Huckleberry Finn hurting people, actually causing harm to others; whereas, in the other case, we don’t feel nearly as confident. I think that Arpaly is neutral on this point, at least for now. She acknowledges that an account of what makes an action right is a gap in her account. But, as I noted earlier, this could also be viewed as an improvement, since her account makes the case for the goodness of these qualities – like Huck’s brand of sympathy – which doesn’t depend on a particular background theory.

One of her targets in the later part of the book is the claim that agent-autonomy underlies normative-autonomy. Agent-autonomy is the ’self-control’ sense of autonomy, and there are numerous ways to spell out this sense. However it is spelled out, though, it is distinct from normative-autonomy, which is respect for persons, or respect for their autonomy. Many hold the view that in order for normative-autonomy to be warranted, the agent must be exhibiting agent-autonomy. Arpaly critically discusses this claim, focusing on cases where it seems that we ought to respect a person’s decisions (i.e. normative-autonomy) though that person does not seem to be fully agent-autonomous. Her aim is fairly modest; she simply wants to show that there is no obvious connection between the two.

I guess that what I would want from the account is more sharpness and precision. To say that “both reason responsiveness and authenticity, if depth of concern is a substantial part of authenticity, are relevant to moral praiseworthiness and blameworthiness, and hence to moral responsibility”(131) doesn’t do much to differentiate her account from what a lot of other different accounts would be committed to. “Relevant” covers a lot of territory, and her claims are driven more by cases than by theory. For example, I would very much agree with her on this, that ’responsiveness to reasons’ is relevant, but then disagree with her take on some of the examples she uses. The agent, to even be an agent, needs to be responsive to reasons. It is responsiveness to the right sorts of reasons which contribute to praiseworthiness, but in the end what really matters is – what does the agent do, how does her behavior make a positive difference (or, more realistically, how could it reasonably be expected to make a positive difference)? Arpaly doesn’t want to go in this direction, but on my view this is one other way to differentiate the Huck Finn’s from the monsters who act horribly, though tormented by their own behavior. They are responsive to the right sorts of reasons emotionally, but it makes no difference to what they actually do. However, Arpaly doesn’t want to commit herself in this direction. But this is basically a quibble. Arpaly has done an excellent job of generating an account of moral worth that is far more nuanced than most.

There are gaps in the account, which she readily acknowledges, but these can and should be viewed as interesting issues for future exploration. Arpaly has written a book that is philosophically interesting and engaging. I encourage you to read it. You will not be disappointed.


1. See my discussion of this issue in Uneasy Virtue (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2001), particularly in Chapters 1 and 2.

2. See, for example, Jonathan Bennett’s essay “The Conscience of Huckleberry Finn,” Philosophy (1974), 123-34.