Unruly Words: A Study of Vague Language

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Diana Raffman, Unruly Words: A Study of Vague Language, Oxford University Press, 2014, 215pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199915101.


Reviewed by Jonas Åkerman, Stockholm University


After twenty years as one of the most prominent contributors to the philosophical debate on vagueness, Diana Raffman has finally published her first book on this topic. She has abandoned her earlier view that vagueness is to be analysed as a form of context-sensitivity,[1] and offers a new theory of vagueness, which aims to combine features that have previously been regarded as incompatible: a semantic (non-epistemic) analysis of vagueness and a classical logic and semantics for vague language.[2] In support of her view, Raffman puts forward not only sophisticated philosophical arguments, but also empirical results gathered from psychological studies of how ordinary speakers actually use vague words. All of this is presented in an engaging and clear, yet relaxed prose, making these highly original and interesting thoughts easily accessible to anyone with an interest in vagueness and related issues. In view of this, Unruly Words is likely to become at least as influential as Raffman's previous groundbreaking work in this area.

The book is divided into five chapters. The introductory chapter offers a review of previous theories and some initial observations about the character of vagueness and its relation to other features with which it often co-occurs, like gradability and context-sensitivity. Chapter two presents an alternative analysis of borderline cases, called the Incompatibilist Analysis (IA), according to which borderline cases should be defined in terms of contraries, like 'green' and 'blue' rather than in terms of contradictories, like 'blue' and 'not-blue'. Chapter three develops a semantic framework for accommodating some varieties of context-sensitivity typically exhibited by vague words, captured under the label 'V-index sensitivity'. V-index sensitivity is compared with indexicality -- the contextual variability in reference exhibited by expressions like 'I', 'here' and 'now' -- and Raffman convincingly argues that these two, despite some commonalities, are importantly different. Even more importantly, it is argued that none of these varieties of context-sensitivity bears any essential relationship to vagueness. Chapter four is dedicated to the Multiple Range Theory of vagueness, according to which vagueness consists in there being multiple permissible ways of applying a word (even bracketing all forms of context-sensitivity). This theory is then applied to the most central tasks for a theory of vagueness: accounting for truth and validity, and solving the Sorites paradox. Chapter five concerns the competent use of vague words, and it also deals with a dynamic version of the Sorites paradox, known as the forced march Sorites. Raffman claims that this puzzle can be solved in terms of a certain dynamic effect in competent speakers' application of vague words -- a so-called hysteresis effect. She presents an empirical study providing evidence of such an effect, and it is then explained how these observations can also be seen as implementing the Multiple Range Theory of vagueness.

Having given this brief summary, I will for the remainder of this review focus on chapters two and four, where, in my view, the most original, controversial and interesting contributions are to be found.

Raffman's presentation of IA departs from the following neutral characterization of borderline cases: "Borderline cases for a predicate 'Φ' are items whose satisfaction of 'Φ' is in some sense unclear or problematic" (25). According to the Standard Analysis (SA) a borderline case for 'Φ' is neither definitely Φ nor definitely non-Φ. Given a semantic (rather than an epistemic) conception of vagueness (and definiteness), this means that neither 'x is Φ' nor 'x is not Φ' can be assigned a classical truth-value (i.e., truth or falsity) when x is a borderline case for 'Φ'. Thus, it is standardly assumed that the adoption of a semantic theory of vagueness inevitably leads to the rejection of classical semantics, in particular bivalence.

Raffman argues that if we can only give up SA, according to which borderline cases are conceived in terms of the opposition between a predicate and its negation, we can combine a semantic theory of borderline cases and vagueness with a classical logic and semantics. According to IA, "borderline cases for a predicate 'Φ' are not-Φ, the sentence 'x is not-Φ' is true, and the sentence 'x is Φ' is false" (26). Since the negation here is classical, bivalence is not threatened by the possibility of borderline cases.

The key idea behind IA is that borderline cases are to be conceived in terms of the opposition between a predicate and one of its proximate incompatibles. What does this mean? First, incompatible predicates 'Φ' and 'Φ*' are contrary predicates for which there is a Φ/Φ* ordering, i.e., a linear ordering of items on a dimension decisive of the application of both 'Φ' and 'Φ*', progressing from an item that is clearly Φ (hence clearly not-Φ*) to an item that is clearly Φ* (hence clearly not-Φ). Second, two incompatible predicates 'Φ' and 'Φ*' are proximate just in case there are items in a replete Φ/Φ* ordering (i.e., one that contains all possible items that can be so ordered) that can competently be classified as Φ, and competently be classified as Φ*. Here is Raffman's proposal:

1.     For any proximate incompatible predicates 'Φ' and 'Φ*', x is a Φ[Φ*] borderline case if and only if x belongs to a Φ/Φ* ordering but is neither Φ nor Φ*.

2.     For any predicate 'Φ', x is a borderline case for 'Φ' if and only if there is some proximate incompatible predicate 'Φ*' such that x is a Φ[Φ*] borderline case. (38)

As usual, the borderline cases are located in the middle of the Φ/Φ* ordering, but since 'Φ' and 'Φ*' are not contradictories but merely contraries, these items can be classified as neither Φ nor Φ* without thereby threatening any classical principles. This is a semantic analysis, since the Φ[Φ*] borderline cases arise from semantic features of 'Φ' and 'Φ*'; Φ[Φ*] borderline cases "fall within the gap" between their extensions, as it were (41). But there is no gap between the extension and anti-extension of 'Φ' or 'Φ*'. On IA, being a Φ[Φ*] borderline case entails being not-Φ as well as being not-Φ*. Consequently, the not-Φ items include the borderline cases for 'Φ' as well as the Φ*-items (the same holds mutatis mutandis for the not-Φ* items).

To what extent is IA intuitively plausible? Raffman starts by arguing that there is at least one sense in which IA seems rather natural. She shows how the main idea of IA is reflected in dictionary entries as well as philosophical writings in that borderline cases are often characterized in terms of incompatibles rather than contraries (many philosophers slide between these) (33-35).

Nevertheless, as Raffman is well aware, IA runs counter to several widely accepted ideas about the nature of borderline cases, the most central of which is the idea that the Φ-status of a borderline case for 'Φ' is indeterminate (31-32). Recall that on IA, borderline cases for 'Φ' are not-Φ, and thus have a determinate Φ-status. How then, if at all, can IA capture the indeterminacy intuitively associated with borderline cases?

Raffman concedes that IA cannot accommodate the intuition that borderline cases for 'Φ' are neither definitely Φ nor definitely not-Φ (56), but she denies that borderline cases have an indeterminate status in this sense. She does allow that they can have an indeterminate status in two other ways, both of which are "logically innocuous". First, there is a sense in which an item that belongs to a Φ/Φ* ordering but is neither Φ nor Φ* is indeterminate, since it "belongs to no category currently in play" (60). Second, borderline cases for 'F' can be competently classified as either ΦΦ* or Φ[Φ*] borderline, and this variability, Raffman suggests, can be understood as a form of indeterminacy: "There is no single correct way to classify these items" (57).

If one still finds the indeterminacy intuition in its original formulation compelling, one is not likely to be very impressed by the fact that IA can accommodate these other kinds of indeterminacy. From this point of view, there will still seem to be a crucial feature of borderline cases that IA -- in contrast to SA -- fails to take seriously. But if one is inclined to follow Raffman in taking this intuition to be less robust, these alternative forms of indeterminacy might play a part in explaining it away.

I cannot here do full justice to Raffman's case for IA, or the interesting and rich discussion she provides on these issues, but two points deserve special mention. First, on IA there is no need to introduce a definiteness operator. When borderline cases are defined in terms of the opposition between contraries rather than contradictories, they can consistently be said to fall in the extension of neither, even given a full endorsement of classical logic and semantics. Second, IA rules out the possibility of so-called higher-order borderline cases, i.e., borderline cases between the Φ-items and the borderline-Φ-items in a Φ/Φ* ordering. Recall that on IA, a borderline case for 'Φ' is an item in a (replete) Φ/Φ* ordering that is neither Φ nor Φ*. If something in this ordering is to qualify as a higher-order borderline case for 'Φ' on IA, it must be neither ΦΦ* nor borderline-Φ. Intuitively, it must be located between the Φ-items and the borderline-Φ items. But the definition simply does not leave room for this possibility, since it dictates that any item in the ordering that is neither Φ nor Φ* counts as borderline-Φ.

The elimination of the definiteness operator and higher order borderlines yields a simpler theory and avoids the complications that come with these notions. One may of course be inclined to think that such a theory would leave out something essential, the lack of which could not be outweighed by simplicity. However, in order to be dialectically effective in this context, such an inclination would need to be complemented by some independent argument, since, as Raffman points out, neither of these notions has any clear basis in ordinary speech or common sense (60-62). Unless it can be shown that they are not mere artefacts of SA, as Raffman suggests, it is far from clear that accommodating them is a reasonable adequacy condition on an analysis of borderline cases. Raffman has plenty to say about why SA is more problematic, and less intuitively plausible than IA, and she also argues that the notion of higher order borderlines is independently "fishy" (64-70). These considerations (which I do not have the space to account for here) are not meant to be decisive, but rather to underscore the advantage of a view that dispenses with this notion.

As Raffman is well aware, IA too has some odd features. For instance, IA suggests that 'not-Φ' may lack borderline cases even though 'Φ' does not. First, according to IA, 'Φ' and 'not-Φ' cannot share borderline cases. Second, as Raffman argues, it seems difficult in general to come up with a recipe for finding a proximate incompatible with which 'not-Φ' can share borderline cases (42-43).

Raffman does not seem too worried about this somewhat surprising consequence. She points out that in contrast to 'Φ', 'not-Φ' has a heterogeneous extension -- for instance, the extension of 'not-blue' contains things of many different colours, including borderline cases for 'blue' -- and suggests that this may be part of the explanation for this asymmetry between these predicates (192n); once we observe this heterogeneity, we should be sceptical of the idea of a symmetry between contradictories (63).

Here it may be objected that even if there are certain respects in which 'Φ' and 'not-Φ' are asymmetrical, there are other respects in which they should be expected to be symmetrical. For instance, it seems very plausible that we should expect 'not-Φ' to be vague insofar as 'Φ' is. And if 'not-Φ' is vague, it should be expected to have borderline cases, just like 'Φ'. Thus, 'not-Φ' should be expected to have borderline cases, contrary to what IA suggests. But Raffman has the resources to block this objection, since on her Multiple Range Theory of vagueness (which will be considered in more detail shortly) possession of borderline cases is neither necessary nor sufficient for vagueness (132). Thus, she can grant that both 'Φ' and 'not-Φ' are vague, but still maintain that the former has borderline cases whereas the latter does not. Whether or not this claim is intuitively plausible, or in line with common sense, is of course arguable, but from the point of view of Raffman's own theory, it does seem perfectly coherent.

A closely related worry is that IA appears to entail that the extensions of vague predicates are sharply bounded, since there are no possible borderline cases between Φ-items and not-Φ-items. Even if the ordering is replete, there will be a cut-off in the ordering, i.e., an item that is Φ immediately followed by an item that is not-Φ. How can one square the presence of such a boundary with the assumption that 'Φ' is a vague predicate? Well, again, on Raffman's view, neither the distinction between sharp and blurred boundaries, nor the distinction between vagueness and precision, is understood in terms of borderline cases.

It is now time to turn to the part of Raffman's account that is meant to underwrite these replies to the above worries concerning IA: The Multiple Range Theory of vagueness (MRT).

MRT is based on the observation that there seem to be multiple ways of correctly applying a vague predicate. Even when all contextual factors (as represented in the V-index) are fixed, there are several different ranges of items to which a vague predicate 'Φ' can competently be applied. Any choice of a particular range on a particular occasion seems semantically arbitrary, and "hence not legislative" (92). On the basis of her conviction that we should "ground our theorizing about vagueness as deeply as possible in commonsense intuition and our actual competent use of vague words" (12), Raffman proposes that "the multiple competent ways of applying a vague predicate relative to a given V-index reflect multiple ranges of application in the semantics of the term" (96), where ranges of applications are sets of values or properties, which are instantiated by objects that make up the V-extensions of vague predicates (relative to given V-indices). But according to Raffman, mere "first-level" multiplicity is not sufficient for vagueness, since that would intuitively come too close to having sharp boundaries. Thus, she suggests that vagueness requires multiplicity on higher levels as well. More precisely, she suggests that "a predicate 'Φ' is vague only if 'Φ' and also 'range of application of "Φ"' and its indefinitely many iterations have multiple arbitrarily different ranges of application" (107). It is, at least in part, this "iterated multiplicity" that makes a predicate vague, and blurs the boundaries of its extension.

So, on MRT, the notions of vagueness and precision are not understood in terms of borderline cases or bivalence, but rather in terms of the notion of range of application: precision consists in possession of a single range of application. To say that a boundary between the extension and the anti-extension is sharp is to say that it is a unique legislative division. In the light of this, it should be clear enough how Raffman's replies to the above worries about IA are grounded in MRT.

Let us now turn to how Raffman deals with the most central tasks for a theory of vagueness, i.e., accounting for truth and validity and solving the Sorites paradox. On MRT, the extension of a vague predicate and the truth-value of a vague sentence containing it are relative to a V-index and a range of application. The notions of truth and falsity involved here are supposed to be "plain old regular truth and falsity" (109), and Raffman contends that when it comes to vague predicates, "Ordinary truth is truth relative to a competent way of applying a predicate" (113). The crucial feature of valid arguments is taken to be that they are truth-preserving relative to any given V-index and range of application (120). As for the Sorites paradox, Raffman asks us to consider a series of coloured patches proceeding from patch #1, a central blue, to #30, a central green, arranged so that each patch is incrementally different from its successor. Then she presents a Sorites paradox of the following form:

1.     Patch #1 is blue.

2.     For any n, if patch #n is blue, then patch #(n+1) is blue.

3.     Therefore patch #30 is blue. (122)

The argument is valid on her view, but since there is a last value in any range of application for 'blue', premise 2 is always false. Thus, the argument is unsound.

Raffman emphasizes that the last value in a range of application is not supposed to mark a sharp semantic boundary, but merely a permissible stopping place (122). One cannot competently go on to apply 'blue' to all the patches in the series, but no particular stopping place is mandatory. She suggests that part of the reason why the Sorites argument seems initially compelling is that we confuse the claim that any application of 'blue' to one patch but not to its successor is arbitrary, with the claim that any application of 'blue' to one patch but not to its successor is impermissible. The latter claim is what is needed for the paradox to arise, but only the former is true.

To be clear, Raffman's view is not contextualist or agent relativist:[3] she does not take a competent speaker's application of 'Φ' at a certain time to determine a semantic boundary for 'Φ', not even relative to that particular time and speaker. The use of a predicate is variable, but its multiple extensions as determined by its semantics are fixed (relative to a V-index). As Raffman puts it, "the semantics is multiple, not variable" (101).

There is a lot in this account that deserves to be discussed in more detail, but I will restrict myself to raising a general worry, which, I think, stands out as particularly important. It concerns the sense in which MRT is a classical theory. Granted, on MRT, truth can be classically defined relative to each single range of application. The problem is that according to MRT, the semantics of vague words, together with all the facts about how they are used, do not in general allow for a single range of application to be determined for sentences/utterances containing them, even relative to a context that can be made as specific as we like. As long as a vague word is not made precise, it has an iterated multiplicity of ranges of application; indeed, that is what its vagueness consists in according to MRT. So, it seems that what we really get is not an account of truth for vague language, since that would require that truth for sentences/utterances be defined relative to an iterated multiplicity of ranges of application.[4] As long as vagueness -- as characterized by MRT -- remains, there is, for items whose membership in the extension varies across ranges of application, no single classical evaluation to be had, and thus no assignment of single classical truth-values to sentences/utterances concerning such items.[5] Arguably, a theory that assigns a multiplicity of classical truth-values to many sentences/utterances (relative to context) of a vague language L does not really provide a classical semantics for L.

So, in the end it is not entirely clear that Raffman satisfies her ambition to give a semantic, yet classical account of vagueness. But of course, this is a very high ambition. Her attempt -- successful or not -- is admirable, and many of the highly original ideas put forward in this book are worth engaging with for their own sake. Overall, Unruly Words is a pleasure to read, and it provides plenty of material for thought and discussion. I strongly recommend it for anyone involved or interested in the philosophical debate on vagueness.


Thanks to Mikael Pettersson for helpful comments on an earlier draft.


Åkerman, J. (2012) "Contextualist Theories of Vagueness". Philosophy Compass 7: 470-480.

Åkerman, J. (2013) "Forced-march Sorites Arguments and Linguistic Competence". dialectica 67: 403-426.

Keefe, R. (2000) Theories of Vagueness. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Raffman, D. (1994) "Vagueness Without Paradox". Philosophical Review 103: 41-74.

Raffman, D. (1996) "Vagueness and Context Relativity". Philosophical Studies 81: 175-192.

[1] See Raffman (1994) and (1996). See Åkerman (2012) for discussion of this and other contextualist views.

[2] See Keefe (2000) for an overview and critical discussion of the main theories in the offing (except contextualism), and a defence of supervaluationism, the standard semantic theory of vagueness.

[3] For a discussion of agent relativism, and how it differs from contextualism, see Åkerman (2013).

[4] Recall that the notion of truth is supposed to be "plain old regular truth" (109), so we should expect sentences/utterances to have truth-values (at least derivatively).

[5] Even if it would be possible to complement Raffman's theory in its current form with an account of how a single value could be determined for vague sentences/utterances (semantically or pragmatically), that would go against the very spirit of MRT.