Using Words and Things: Language and Philosophy of Technology

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Mark Coeckelbergh, Using Words and Things: Language and Philosophy of Technology, Routledge, 2017, 295 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138694163.

Reviewed by Krzysztof Ziarek, University at Buffalo


While the title aptly reflects the cluster of issues and relations discussed by Coeckelbergh, the book's focus is the philosophy of technology and its main aim is to inquire into and begin articulating in new and more complex ways the relationship between technology and language. This undertaking comes as a response to what the author perceives as "a gap between philosophy of technology and philosophy of language" (8). To remedy the lack of systematic reflection in contemporary philosophy of technology on the relation between technology and language, Coeckelbergh engages with a wide spectrum of texts not only in philosophy of technology but also, and primarily, in philosophy of language, postmodern thought and poststructuralism, as well as with more recent responses to those developments.

This breadth of treatment is one of the book's strengths, as it allows Coeckelbergh to survey an impressive array of texts that are infrequently discussed together or seen as sources of parallel insights: from Wittgenstein, Heidegger, Husserl, Dewey, and Merleau-Ponty, to Austin, Searle, McLuhan, Foucault, Lyotard, Derrida, Ricoeur, Baudrillard, Virilio, Dreyfus, Ihde, Latour, Akrich, Verbeek, Harman, Kellner, Pickering, Winner, and others. As Coeckelbergh declares, his approach is synthetic and integrative, as his study focuses on finding similarities between an array of thinkers from Continental and analytic traditions of philosophy, in order to facilitate asking questions and opening new, undeveloped or underappreciated avenues of inquiry into our understanding of technology, avenues that are opened specifically by parallels between philosophy of language and philosophy of technology. As the "Introduction" indicates, this take reappraises the old debate about the relation and the distinction between words and things and the role they play in shaping experience and thought. Following this line of inquiry, Coeckelbergh is less interested in faithfully reflecting the approaches developed by various thinkers than in inducing rapprochements and in creatively modifying and extending those views by injecting insights from other sources. Casting this wide net of relationships and points of confluence among a panoply of thinkers, the book provides an overview of the relation between language and technology in 20th and 21st century philosophy, on the one hand, and assembles a set of concepts and nodal points which are to help future inquiry into technology and into the role it plays in shaping experience and thought, on the other. By design, it is a patchwork of ideas meant to provoke questioning and provide tools for the reassessment of philosophy of technology in light of insights from a wide array of broadly contemporary approaches to language and to the concept of the human being, including the relatively recent notion of the posthuman.

The foundation of Coeckelbergh's dialogic approach comes from the intersection of ideas about language and technology in Wittgenstein and Heidegger, although in the overall perspective of the book, it is Wittgenstein who emerges as the key interlocutor -- and in particular, his notions of "form of life" and "language game." The book starts with "criticizing [the] instrumental view of technology by using Wittgenstein and Heidegger" (11). The critique of the instrumental and anthropological -- perhaps better, anthropocentric -- conception of technology comes from Heidegger's well-known "The Question Concerning Technology." Using Wittgenstein's comparison of language and technology, Coeckelbergh extends Wittgenstein's understanding of language to philosophy of technology: technology is thus considered in terms of its being embedded in forms of life and analyzed in its use, that is, in the various social and cultural "games" in which technology is practiced today but which it also informs and shapes in crucial and sometimes decisive ways.

From this initial platform, the book sets out to plot relations between technology, humans, and language, and does so by framing its three main parts in terms of the question: "Who or what speaks?" (9): technology, language, or humans? (9) The notion of speaking is used both literally and metaphorically, and has to do primarily with the sense of agency, of the active role that each one of the three interwoven elements (technology, language, humans) plays in the nexus of relations. Inspired by Heidegger's famous dictum, "language speaks" ("Die Sprache spricht"), Coeckelbergh brings into the picture McLuhan's claim that the medium is the message, that is, that, in addition to the idea that humans and language can speak, technologies too "speak" through the way they shape -- in their use -- forms of life, and thus experience, thought, and culture. As Coeckelbergh himself admits, the three positions described in the three parts: "Humans Speak," "Language Speaks," "Technology Speaks," are "extreme," each a kind of "ideal type" (9), describing positions that do not actually exists and that quickly come to be complicated through discussion of intersections between various approaches to language. One could thus raise the question as to whether this initial, heuristic separation of the domains of humans, language, and technology with regard to speaking, only to immediately problematize it and de facto abandon it, is necessary. One might also ask whether starting instead with the complex picture with which the book ends -- but which also emerges in virtually all chapters and is already signaled by the two framing figures, Wittgenstein and Heidegger -- would not provide a quicker entry into the problematic. This might also allow for a deeper development of the key issue: how exactly and in what modes the "speaking" of humans, technology, and language are entangled, and how such "entanglement" -- this concept is introduced and glossed in the last chapter of the book -- entails the rethinking of how we understand language, humans, and technology.

In the "Introduction" (1-19), the book provides a clear and useful sketch of its scope and main ideas, as well as an overview of its chapters. In a similar vein, the last chapter, "Using and Performing with Words and Things" (253-287) recapitulates its historical and conceptual trajectory, assembling lists of conceptual elements and diverse modes of "speaking" taken from various approaches considered in the study. Part I, "Humans Speak," discusses how humans speak about and give meaning to technology, using Wittgenstein and Heidegger to complicate the approaches developed by Searle and Austin. Part II, "Language Speaks," discusses both the social construction of artefacts and postmodern/poststructuralist approaches to language and text, suggesting that, in the extreme, it is all about language, which means that humans and reality, and thus technology, simply "disappear" from view. (But does such an extreme exist, or is it, as the author himself suggests later on, rather a misunderstanding of the complex postmodern notion of language/text?) This part is a little problematic because it cites, without adequate engagement and critique, and thus prolongs or gives some legitimacy to, the hasty and mistaken view that postmodern ideas of language/text void or nullify reality.

At the same time, this position is called into question in Part III, "Technology Speaks," in which Coeckelbergh emphasizes the importance of thinking about technology with language, even through (our understanding of) language. In fact, one of the merits of the book is this insistence that it is philosophy of language -- from Wittgenstein and Heidegger through Derrida -- that can provide insight into technology and initiate a more complex understanding of its role in today's society. Foregrounding language, Coeckelbergh can take issue with the dismissal of language in postphenomenology, in the approach proposed by Ihde and his followers, on the one hand, or by Latour, and supplement these accounts of technology and social ontology of objects with the perspective of language games, forms of life, or narrative (via Ricoeur). The short Part IV, "Humans, Language, and Technology Speak," leaves behind the separate emphases of the preceding parts and underscores the "linguistic" entanglements of humans, language, and technology in a manner of shared and reciprocally shaped speaking, in which humans, technology, and language all play an active, "speaking," role. As Coeckelbergh puts it, emphasizing in the concluding part the notions of performativity and the role of arts:

There is a speaking; there is a performance. And both speech and the speaker are hybrid human/nonhuman, or, at least, there is always co-speaking. There is no pure subject when it comes to speech, understood as use and performance. Try to find a subject and it will be contaminated by objectivity. In use and performance, the human is already posthuman, contaminated, enmeshed, and entangled with words and things. But neither is there a pure object: words and tools -- as words and tools -- mean nothing outside human use. Try to find an object and it will be contaminated by subjectivity. (279)

The concluding part returns to the philosophy of technology to chart a preliminary framework for asking further questions about technology as part of contemporary forms of life, as participating in revealing contemporary experience and shaping, "speaking," its emergent forms. It projects a sense of shared agency, of a co-speaking and a co-shaping, which should guide continued reflection on technology. This broad and interlinked framework, which stitches together concepts from various thinkers (Wittgenstein, Heidegger, Searle, Ihde, Latour, Ricoeur, among others), allows for an innovative and flexible approach. At the same time, it raises some questions about the very terms that are centrally employed in the study and that nonetheless, one could argue, remain under-defined. For instance, the three interfaced terms, "humans," "language," and "technology," appear to be treated as unproblematic. This approach allows in part for the continuous flow of ideas between various thinkers and diverse orientations -- part of the explicit project of the book -- but risks glossing over some crucial differences. While Coeckelbergh states that he is interested, and for good reasons, in finding parallels and intersections rather than faithfully reproducing the positions of the thinkers he engages, some of the distinctions the book sets aside can in fact be significant and productive for the very project he proposes. It would be especially important in this context to articulate more sharply the understanding of both language and technology. At various points, Coeckelbergh cites approaches that see language and/or technology as a tool or an instrument, only to add quickly that both language and technology are "so much more." Yet, because this is the case, the very idea that language or technology is an instrument needs to be called more forcefully into question, just as the positions based on such notions need to be problematized more rigorously.

I will bring up three issues in this context to conclude the review. Using Heidegger's critique of the instrumental/anthropological understanding of technology, Coeckelbergh mentions Heidegger's notion of the "essence" of technology, only to set it aside. However, Heidegger's "essence" (Wesen) refers not to the idea or concept, and certainly not to the uses, of technology but to the "modern" manner of the unfolding of being, which makes technology in its modern senses and uses possible in the first place. As such, this Wesen, as Heidegger underscores, is nothing technological, that is, it is not a technological product, process of production, or knowledge. Rather, it is a way of "revealing" into a technological enframing of being (of experience, things, words, etc.). That is why technological objects, knowledge, or processes do not themselves "reveal" in this sense, but, on the contrary, can in fact conceal the force with which the "essence" of technology reveals/unfolds the world today.

Similarly, even between Wittgenstein and Heidegger, important similarities notwithstanding, what is at issue is precisely the understanding of language: whether language can be exhausted in its "essence" (its unfolding) by terms like games or forms of life, let alone those of tool, instrument, or communication. That is why ultimately the very notion of "use," which is of key importance to Coeckelbergh, has to be interrogated and problematized both more rigorously and in greater detail. In Heidegger, for instance, the technological revealing covers over -- and tends to disallow, render unreal -- the poietic revealing. That is why language can appear in its technological crystallization as a tool -- say of communication or programming -- even though it, at least for Heidegger, remains poietic in its essence. Language thus is not an element of the triad on par with technology and humans, or in parallel with them, as in Coeckelbergh's schematic approach, but is integral to whether and how the revealing takes place -- through human participation -- as technological or poietic. In other words, the relation between technology and language can, and should, be seen in fact as much more integral than it appears in the book. This is particularly significant, and again Heidegger can be an important, and here unexplored, possibility, with regard to the relation between words and things and the perennial question as to whether and to what extent they are comparable in their ontological status.

The third issue concerns the use of the term "transcendental." Following Foucault, Coeckelbergh discusses uses of technology and of language in the perspective of historically preexisting things, which he takes not only as objects but also as conditions of possibility and applies the name "transcendental" to them, claiming to revise the sense of the term. Yet in this way, all analyses of the uses or practices of language or technology become "transcendental," as there are always preexisting things/conditions, historical contexts, forms of life or language and, as Coeckelbergh adds, technological, games.

These concerns notwithstanding, Coeckelbergh's book is an important and welcome study, especially for the way it critiques the dismissal or neglect of language in contemporary philosophy of technology, counters this omission by integrating such philosophy with the postmodern investigations of language, and thus sketches new possibilities for conceptualizing technology. In this sense, this book is perhaps more "postmodern" than it appears at first blush.