Justice and Foreign Policy

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Michael Blake, Justice and Foreign Policy, Oxford University Press, 2013, 135pp., $49.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780199552009.

Reviewed by Cindy Holder, University of Victoria


Michael Blake's ambitious, thought-provoking book engages with some of the most basic issues in global justice. The Preface poses the question: May those responsible for the foreign policy of a liberal state use their power to promote liberal democracy in other states? Blake's ultimate answer to this question is, "Yes, but not in the way or for the reasons that you might think." Some of his arguments work, some don't. Along the way the reader is treated to a series of frank, valuable insights about the limitations of existing frameworks and the potential for a different set of departure points in approaches to global justice.

The book is divided into five chapters. The first begins with a very simple premise: that insofar as justification of states requires justification of the state system -- of the division of the world into states -- a state's structure and institutions must be justified not only to its own people, but also to people in other states (7). For Blake, the key to answering this question is recognizing that the international realm is a "second-order" site of justice -- a site at which individuals' participation in coercive institutions is mediated by their participation in and governance by states. The mediated nature of participation in the international realm has implications for what individuals owe to one another because it means that international institutions coerce individuals indirectly, through coercion and shaping of their states, in contrast to the direct coercion of individuals that state-based institutions enact. Consequently, what individuals owe to, and may claim of, those with whom they share a state differs from what is owed to and may be claimed of those with whom a state is not shared. Insofar as different states have different capacities and powers within and with respect to international institutions, those who inhabit different states will have differential responsibilities for how international institutions coerce and shape other states. Because of this, not only whether individuals share a state, but also which states they (respectively) share, will matter to determinations of what each owes (and what each may claim) at the global level. Blake is particularly interested in what is owed by those whose state is wealthy and powerful with internal structures that meet the criteria of liberalism.

Blake takes as given that the current division of the world into states is a fact to which theory must respond, that there are vast differences in the economic and military power of states, and that this division of the world into states with significantly unequal power, wealth and influence is unlikely to change in this lifetime or the next. These givens are a touchstone for subsequent arguments, as he seeks to systematically work through the implications of a state-based political order characterized by significant, systematic, and enduring inequalities in wealth and power for duties of global justice.

In the second chapter Blake explores whether the fact of a world divided into states implies a principled duty to refrain from intervening in the operations of other states, and whether the fact of significant differences in wealth and power implies a duty to reshape the global community's basic structure to establish greater parity in states' international capacities. He argues that the answer to both questions is "No", because duties of justice, whether at the local or at the global level, are ultimately duties to individuals. As such, they do not easily or consistently generate general constraints or obligations with respect to the state structures under which a set of individuals live.

In the third chapter Blake takes up the question of whether those whose states meet the criteria of liberalism have an obligation to work for liberal rights to be available to people everywhere. He concludes that the answer is "Yes", but that this does not easily or consistently generate permission to intervene in the operations of other states. Moreover, when fully understood, the obligation to advance liberal rights for people everywhere imposes both practical and principled constraints on the forms that intervention may take and on the policies that may be pursued, including policies regarding adherence to international legal obligations.

In chapters four and five Blake works through the implications of a state-based political order for duties of justice given the impact of disparities in the power and wealth on the lives of individuals within those states. He concludes that philosophical liberalism does not require global distributive equality, but that it does imply substantial constraints on the kinds of agreements and policies that may be pursued. Blake grounds these constraints in the fact that international agreements and organizations engage in inter-state coercion. Because of this, those who make policy for a liberal state must ask whether the coercion applied through an agreement or organization is justifiable from the perspective of the people living in the states subject to it. If the coercion cannot be justified from the perspective of individuals living in the states to which it is applied, then it will not be acceptable for a liberal state to support or participate in that agreement.

It is interesting how Blake uses the simple and specific question of what liberalism demands of those who develop and execute foreign policy to fundamentally shift the framework within which theorizing about global justice proceeds. Working from the assumption that enjoyment of the benefits of a liberal state commits that state's population to sustaining and realizing liberal values, he asks what those who act on behalf of liberal states must do to meet that commitment. In so doing, Blake turns the question of what global justice requires of individuals living within a liberal state into a question about how those who control a liberal state's apparatus may and must use it. This is a fundamental reframing of what is at issue in debates about global justice, as global justice becomes about what governments must secure for people living outside of their state to maintain their internal basis of legitimacy. Given this framing, global justice is not primarily about what morality requires individuals to do for people living elsewhere (although this is part of what explains why global justice requires what it does). And it is not primarily about what those who legitimately govern a state may claim of other states (although global justice will have implications for that question). Global justice is about what a state owes to other states' populations.

Within this framework, promoting democratic self-governance is not a question of what people within a liberal state must allow those who govern other states to do. Rather, it is about how people within a liberal state may and must use their state's apparatus. Blake argues that philosophical liberalism constrains people to use the state only in keeping with respect for individual autonomy and forbids using the state in ways that undermine capacities for autonomy. This, the requirement to respect autonomy and refrain from undermining it, is what grounds the duty to promote democratic self-governance. This is why, in Blake's view, worries that positing an obligation to promote democracy fails to respect difference and licenses imperialism are misplaced: promoting democracy is not about making sure others are governed in the "right" way, but about ensuring that individuals' use their state justifiably.

Blake's argument that the international realm is a second-order site of justice is key to both motivating and supporting his positive arguments. For example, that individuals' relationships at the global level are mediated by states is central to Blake's reasons for rejecting duties of global redistribution and focusing instead on legitimate and illegitimate forms of inter-state coercion. In these arguments, Blake directs attention to what the apparatus of a liberal state is being used to do when those who make policy on its behalf support and participate in agreements and organizations that operate to the economic disadvantage of people in other states.

The book's main weakness is the choice to stay within the framework and the vocabulary set by John Rawls's treatment of global justice in Law of Peoples. That framework takes the central question of global justice to be a question of what constitutes just relationships between states, and it encourages Blake to think of his own question as what a liberal state must do in its foreign policy to live up to its conception of justice. In fact, however, what a liberal state must do to meet the conditions of liberal justice is not Blake's question at all. His question is the one stated above: What may and must people within liberal states use those states to do? Many of Blake's most striking insights originate in his observation that duties of justice are duties to individual persons, mediated and given shape by the structures within which those persons operate. This observation points to a powerful and potentially transformative distinction between the individuals and groups over whom a state's structures range, and in whose name state officials speak and deal, and state structures themselves.

Blake moves some of the way toward embracing this distinction when he treats division of the world into states as an empirical fact. However he does not consistently follow through on the obvious implication of this empirical approach to states, which is that it is a category mistake to describe state structures themselves, as opposed to the individuals and groups that control or make use of those structures, as justified or unjustified, just or unjust. If states are a feature of the landscape, then it does not make sense to ask how states might meet the requirements of justice, any more than it makes sense to ask how oceans or mountains might do so. It makes sense to ask what individuals and communities may and must do with respect to states. It makes sense to ask about the uses to which individuals and communities may and must put a state's apparatus. But to ask what states must do to count as just is not apt. Failing to fully absorb the implications of this point leads Blake to miss the critical potential of his own analysis and to oversimplify the relationship between the international and domestic realms.

A good illustration of this mix of missed opportunity and overstatement is Blake's argument that the fact that the human rights set out in international legal documents are requirements of international law does not, in itself, make them authoritative for those who make policy on behalf of a liberal state. In making this argument, he posits that international law does not and cannot have the same type of normative force as law generated within a state because the process through which international law is created is "at best a sort of compromise" (74). How international law is created means that the conception of human rights that emerges from international legal texts reflects ideas about the content and scope of human rights that all or most states can be expected to accept. However, Blake argues that this -- evidence that all or nearly all states accept the rights set out in international legal instruments -- cannot be a source of authoritativeness. Acceptance by all states can be at most a source of pragmatic value, which may generate some normative force but not the type associated with law. Blake calls this a "deflationary" view of international legal norms, a view according to which they have some normative force, but not to the same degree or of the same kind as domestic legal norms (76).

In this, Blake might seem to be offering a familiar, albeit no longer widely accepted, skepticism about whether international law is a form of law at all. But this interpretation would be too quick. For in his later argument that the value of having a system of rules that imposes some constraint on states may establish an obligation to treat the legal conception of human rights as if it were authoritative, he assumes that having the status of an international legal requirement gives the legal conception of human rights the capacity to constrain. In assuming this -- that being a requirement of international law may in itself enable the rights set out in international legal texts to modify behaviour -- Blake assumes that international law functions as law for those subject to it. His argument for why liberal states may have pragmatic reasons for conforming to the requirements of international human rights presupposes that being an international legal requirement is in itself a reason for the subjects of international law (a set of subjects that includes liberal states) to conform -- that it is normative for them. This suggests that the process through which the legal conception of human rights has been created is not a barrier to its being authoritative. On the contrary, insofar as that process is partially constitutive of what makes the rights set out in international legal texts part of international law, it is a key basis of the legal conception's authority.

And yet, Blake does not appear to view the human rights set out in international legal instruments, or other international legal requirements (such as the norms regarding sovereignty) as having the authority of law for liberal states (76). According to Blake liberal states "should act as if human rights norms were authoritative and regard their preservation and maintenance as matters of important moral gravity" (75), and the norms of international law have "some provisional use as tools" (76). However, the motivation for adherence to these norms is not that they are requirements of a legal system to which states are legitimately subject, but rather the pragmatic value of maintaining and preserving a system of rules that operates as an effective and reliable source of constraint on states' behavior with respect to matters that may justifiably be regulated. This motivation is in apparent contrast with motivations for adherence to requirements of domestic legal norms.

So insofar as international legal norms are part of a system of rules that has the capacity to direct and shape state behavior with respect to matters (such as respect for human rights) that may justifiably be regulated, liberal states may have an obligation to support and promote them in virtue of an obligation to support the system of which they are a part. The system of rules characteristic of international law has developed and maintains its capacity to direct and shape behavior in virtue of widespread acceptance by states that the mechanisms through which its rules are generated and applied are an acceptable and legitimate basis for regulating behavior. Flagrant and persistent refusal to accept the system's rules as regulatory undermines the widespread acceptance necessary for its capacity to constrain. In light of this, the value of the system's capacity to constrain may create an obligation (albeit not all-things-considered) to conform to the system's rules simply in virtue of their status as rules of the system.

Described in this way, there seems very little difference in the grounds on which international and domestic legal norms compel conformity. Both have the particular content they do because of contingent historical facts that led to their being adopted into the legal system of the political community to which they apply. Both are normative for the constituents of the relevant community in part because of the importance of having constraints of that type included in the system and in part because of an obligation to accept that legal system's requirements. There may be instances in which the obligation to conform to a requirement of the system simply in virtue of its being included in the law is overridden by other considerations. Such instances raise ethical questions about the justification and appropriate methods of civil disobedience and the acceptability of vigilantism. They raise such questions in part because they have the authority of law.

Yet, Blake's intuition that there is a difference in normativity between the requirements of the international legal system and a domestic legal system is not offbase. He is correct to think that there is something distinctive about the normativity of international law. His mistake is in thinking that the distinctiveness has to do with how international legal norms are generated.

At the heart of Blake's intuition that the normativity of international law is distinctive is an important observation: insofar as international law has normative force for individuals, this force cannot be generated as it is for laws within the state. This is so not because of how the process through which international legal requirements are adopted, but because of the subjects to whom international law applies. The primary subjects of international law are states, not individual human beings. Because of this, generating normative force for individuals requires a bridge from the law's normativity for its subjects to normativity for individual human beings. Blake is right that the requirements of international law do not automatically or necessarily apply to individuals within states. But this does not imply or presuppose that international law does not have the same degree or type of normativity as domestic law. Blake's failure to fully absorb the implications of his distinction between individuals and their states causes him to miss this crucial point.

Overall, this book is well worth the read. Blake has opened up a host of interesting questions and made visible many questions that were already there but have hitherto been difficult to see. Readers may find much that they disagree with and much that they fail to find persuasive. But they will also find much that is stimulating, interesting and original.