Utilitarianism and Empire

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Bart Schultz and Georgios Varouxakis (eds.), Utilitarianism and Empire, Lexington Books, 2005, 263pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 073911087X.

Reviewed by Anthony Skelton, University of Western Ontario


Classical Utilitarianism, on one reading, is the view according to which an action, rule, policy or social institution is right if and only if it is designed to advance aggregate well-being, hedonistically construed. Relying on some version of this moral framework, the Classical Utilitarians -- Jeremy Bentham, James Mill, John Stuart Mill and Henry Sidgwick -- advocated for a wide range of social, political and legal reforms.

Both their reformist agenda and the time at which they lived led each of the Classical Utilitarians to intellectual entanglements with British imperialism, colonialism and related issues (e.g., race and slavery). However, the nature and extent of their involvement with and relationship to the British imperial project and colonialism in general has not yet been properly or fully analysed. The purpose of this nicely assembled and timely volume is to remedy this situation and, as the editors state in their introduction, 'to bring out, to engage with, the different aspects of the utilitarian legacy that bear directly on questions of race and empire' (5).

Utilitarianism and Empire contains ten essays and an introduction by the editors. There are two essays on Jeremy Bentham, five on John Stuart Mill, and one each on James Mill, Herbert Spencer and Henry Sidgwick. Appropriately, the volume is interdisciplinary, with contributions by philosophers, historians, political scientists and cultural theorists, among others. It is an extremely valuable contribution to the literature devoted to making sense of the history and philosophical viability of utilitarianism. Indeed, a study of this sort could not be timelier, since we are ourselves living in a time where empire building and imperialism continue to thrive and imperil.

The two papers on Bentham are among the most interesting and illuminating in this volume. In his article, "Jeremy Bentham on Slavery and the Slave Trade", Fred Rosen responds to the view that Bentham failed to have the appropriate moral reaction to slavery and slave trading. Bentham's error, it is claimed, is that he held that the security of the property of slave owners had to be balanced against equality in deciding the right public policy to have regarding slavery. This problem is seen clearly, critics contend, in Bentham's advocacy of a gradual rather than immediate emancipation of slaves and the abolition of slavery.

In reply, Rosen demonstrates that Bentham's position is both more sophisticated and more plausible than critics acknowledge. Relying on a little-known letter published in the Public Advertiser on June 6, 1789, Rosen shows that Bentham was clear on the issue of slave trading: it should end without compensation to slave traders. He advocated gradual emancipation, not because he wrongly gave weight to the security and protection of private property, Rosen continues, but out of concern for the protection of slaves: he wanted to ensure that the abolition of slaveholding did not make slaves worse off. For in conjunction with emancipation, what is needed is another economic and social system not based on slavery, 'one that provided subsistence and security for the newly freed slaves and did not leave them in a worse position in relation to their former masters' (45).

Rosen's paper has many virtues. Its chief virtue is that it situates Bentham's view in its historical context, demonstrating that it was rather in sync with the views of many at the time advocating the end of slave trading and slaveholding. A further virtue is that it shows how Bentham used the notion of slavery in many contexts (e.g., in his discussion of colonies) 'to define the human condition in terms of varying degrees of subjection' (43) in an effort to better determine how to politically engage with slavery and its cognates.

In her contribution, "Jeremy Bentham: Legislator of the World?" Jennifer Pitts does a fine job demonstrating how Bentham's views on colonization and empire building are quite distinct from and more palatable than those held by the Mills. Pitts contends that it was James and John Stuart Mill who turned utilitarianism into an imperialist theory, making it appear intolerant of non-Europeans and dubious about their capacities for self-government. This leads her to conclude that there is nothing like a utilitarian position on colonization and empire building: 'with regard to colonies, there was no unitary utilitarian logic but rather a transformation of the tradition that reflected a broader shift in European thought on empire from the late eighteen to the early nineteenth century, away from profound doubts about colonial aspirations and toward vehement and often self-righteous support for them' (61-62).

On Pitts's analysis, Bentham is distinct from the Mills in having little doubt about the capacities and abilities (especially for self-government) of non-European people, and in being much more sceptical of the ethical viability of colonization on account of the fact that he believed that 'empires undermined the greatest happiness of the greatest number in both metropole and colony' (62). Despite this claim, Pitts maintains that 'many of Bentham's anticolonial arguments draw little from utilitarian principles but appeal instead to equity, glory, and the psychology of power and corruption' (63). This is an interesting claim about Bentham's style of argument against colonization. However, it appears to ignore the subtleties of his utilitarianism, which seems to be less direct than otherwise supposed, and how he might have been relying on these notions as part of ad hominem-style arguments in his various writings on colonization and related matters. Rosen also makes the claim that in his discussion of slavery Bentham could well have appealed to 'human rights or talk about liberty' in his arguments against it (35). Yet, he leaves it unclear how this appeal is to be reconciled with Bentham's version of the utilitarian moral framework. A better account of the relationship between Bentham's utilitarianism and his arguments against slavery and colonization would have made these already stellar papers excellent.

The quality of the five papers discussing John Stuart Mill on empire, colonization and race (among other issues) is uniformly high. The most theoretical is the contribution by Martha Nussbaum, "Mill on Happiness: The Enduring Value of a Complex Critique". Although her article does not really touch on the main questions of the volume, it is of interest nonetheless. She aims to 'defend Mill's conception of happiness as a rich resource for feminist thinking and for progressive thinking generally, including thinking about ethnicity and race' (108). Nussbaum argues that Mill's conception of happiness combines elements of both hedonism and the Aristotelian view that happiness consists in 'a specific plurality of valuable activities' (110).

The view that Nussbaum ascribes to Mill is plausible. However, how the two elements fit together coherently and serve as an analysis of happiness is unclear, and nothing she says makes it more lucid. Furthermore, there are many philosophical problems with such an account. For example, what do we do with the person who is reasonably well informed and seemingly not manipulated or coerced or brainwashed but who does not want to engage in the so-called 'valuable activities'? Is it really right to call her unhappy if she turns her back on them but is hedonistically well off nonetheless?

Nussbaum further argues that the conception of happiness that she finds in Mill is an appropriate basis upon which to advance public policy, for it makes 'the realization of a wide range of human opportunities' the goal of political planning rather than merely the satisfaction of desire, which is itself beset with problems (121).[1] For Nussbaum, Mill 'thinks it highly relevant that the values he defends as basic to politics are in some sense rooted in human desire' (121), but he holds that it is 'more than a contingent matter that the constituent parts of flourishing are in fact powerfully and deeply desired' (122). This seems far from clear, however, given Mill's thesis advanced in Utilitarianism and elsewhere that virtue, individuality and self-development -- some of the valuable activities Nussbaum emphasizes -- are desired for their own sake and become parts or ingredients of happiness only because the consciousness of them is a pleasure, or because the consciousness of being without them is a pain or for both reasons together.[2] If this is correct, then for Mill it looks like the valuable activities are linked to human happiness because of the connection they have to pleasure or one's desires and for no other reason, and therefore it seems as though his view is a complex hedonism designed to capture some aspects of Aristotle's view without conceding theoretical ground to it.

Finally, Nussbaum does not deal effectively with the fact that assumptions and claims about what constitute 'valuable activities' have been used both to emancipate but also to subjugate and colonise others. This to my mind makes a hedonist or preference-based view of happiness a more plausible basis for policy than other non-hedonistic or objectivist views of happiness.

Related to discussions of imperialism and empire is the issue of race and racism, and the role they often play in the justification of imperialism and colonization. The papers by David Theo Goldberg and Georgios Varouxakis are of relevance to those concerned with these matters. The debate between them concerns in large part the question of whether or not the term 'racist' should be applied to John Stuart Mill. In "Liberalism's Limits", Goldberg argues that, although Mill was not as virulent a racist as his contemporary Thomas Carlyle, author of the "Occasional Discourse on the Negro Question", he nonetheless subscribed to what Goldberg calls 'polite racism' (130). Mill held that although blacks and other races are not inherently inferior, they are, due to historical and contingent factors, inferior nonetheless.[3] This makes them fit objects for colonial rule, though of a benevolent and temporary sort. Against the accusation that Mill was a racist, in his "Empire, Race, Euro-centrism: John Stuart Mill and His Critics", Georgios Varouxakis argues that, while Mill might have been a Euro-centrist, he was not a racist (142). For to qualify as a racist one must believe in 'the all-importance of biologically transmitted characteristics and in the existence and great significance of inherent traits that are there to stay, with all the deterministic implications of such beliefs' (144). Mill did not believe any such view, as is clear from his response to Carlyle, "The Negro Question".[4]

However, it is not clear that this answers Goldberg's charge, since the account of racism itself is apparently rejected by Goldberg. The debate between Goldberg and Varouxakis cannot be properly resolved without resolving the issue of just what it is to be a racist, and neither paper provides a defence of the rival conceptions of racism that they each espouse. This is vital to determining the question of whether or not Mill or any other Classical Utilitarian was a racist.

The issue of racism emerges again in the longest paper in the volume, Bart Schultz's "Sidgwick's Racism". Schultz's aim is to correct for the fact that almost all research on Henry Sidgwick has 'failed to seriously consider his views on such issues as race and imperialism' (212). Adapting the main line of argument offered in chapter eight of his book Henry Sidgwick, Eye of the Universe: An Intellectual Biography, he argues that Sidgwick's status as a rather saintly figure needs to be reconsidered on account of the fact that he 'harboured racist tendencies', especially in his work in politics and elsewhere.[5]

Because, as Schultz notes, Sidgwick was often less than explicit about his views on religious, sexual and racial matters, one has to dig deep to find them. His case for the claim that Sidgwick was a racist depends in the main on the fact that the latter used the term 'nigger' (220, 224) in private correspondence and on the fact that he was not especially critical of and in fact praised the overtly racist treatises of friends, e.g., Charles Henry Pearson and James Bryce (221-226). In addition, Sidgwick relied on distinctions between 'uncivilized' and 'civilized', among others, in his defence of the British imperial project (226-237). The only compensation is that, as Schultz points out, Sidgwick did not maintain that debasement occurs from racial mixing, he did not think that civilization was a 'monopoly of the white race' (245) and he did hold that with respect to colonization 'the rights of the "semi-civilized" and aboriginal peoples must be protected' (234).

For Schultz, that Sidgwick held these latter views is not enough to save him from the charge of racism. Although his case for the claim that Sidgwick was a racist is not unpersuasive, it would have been much stronger had he clearly outlined his account of what it is to be racist; he says merely that he is working with 'some meaningful sense of the term' (212). But greater precision is required, especially since he does not find that Sidgwick was a racist in Varouxakis's sense of the term.[6] Instead, he speculates that 'Sidgwick did not think that science had established the reality of an afterlife … but he still hoped that it would and was often inclined to think that evidence pointed that way. Perhaps he took a roughly similar attitude toward the matter of hereditary racial differences' (236-237). In addition, Schultz's accusation depends in part on the claim that Sidgwick shared the same views that his friends espoused, even though it is less than obvious that Sidgwick shared all of them (235-236).

Furthermore, Schultz does not fully explain why Sidgwick would have refrained from publishing overtly racist views. After all, it was not impermissible to do so, as Bryce and Pearson show only too well. What would Sidgwick's motive have been? In Henry Sidgwick, Eye of the Universe, Schultz argues that Sidgwick beseeched homosexual friends (especially the poet John Addington Symonds) to remain closeted given the impact that this would have on their standing, a fraud that Sidgwick continued to carry out even after his friends had died.[7] However, there appears to be no analogous set of reasons why Sidgwick would have kept quiet about his racist views. It might be that Sidgwick was too afraid to accept responsibility for these views, but it might also be the case that he refrained from publishing them because he lacked sufficient confidence in them.

In this review, I have discussed only six of the ten contributions to this volume. This should not suggest that the papers in Utilitarianism and Empire not discussed here are unworthy of scholarly attention. David Weinstein's article on Spencer is of particular interest in light of how well it situates Spencer within the Classical Utilitarian tradition. J. Joseph Miller does a nice job of demonstrating how Mill's legal pursuit of Governor Eyre for his misdeeds in Jamaica follow from the fact that 'Eyre represents a particular vision of colonialism (arbitrary despotism wielded only to the advantage of the colonizer) that is fundamentally at odds with Mill's considered conception of colonialism' rather than from the fact that 'Eyre threatens a colonial system whose weaknesses Mill refuses to acknowledge' (172).

This volume is intended for those interested in the history and legacy of the Classical Utilitarians and Classical Utilitarianism. It does not contain an article by a contemporary utilitarian addressing current research in moral theory on race, colonization or empire building. The volume would have benefited from such a contribution, for the issues and questions that the volume raises are all of pressing concern to us now. Such a contribution might have reminded us how alike many of us are to even some of the greatest thinkers of the past in being unwilling or unable to see the horrible costs associated with the promotion of even the highest ideals.[8]

[1] Nussbaum has an unfortunate tendency to equate hedonism about happiness with preferentialism about happiness.

[2]John Stuart Mill, Utilitarianism, ed. Roger Crisp (Oxford: University Press, 1998), Chap IV, Para. 8.

[3] This same form of argument might it seems be used to demonstrate that Mill is a sexist, since he holds (at times at least) that the present inferiority of women to men is due to historical and contingent circumstances, not to the nature of women. Is Mill, then, a 'polite sexist'? For Mill's position on women, see The Subjection of Women (1869), in The Collected Works of John Stuart Mill, ed. J. M. Robson (Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1984), XXI. 259-340.

[4]The Carlyle and Mill essays can be found at: http://cepa.newschool.edu/het/texts/carlyle/negroquest.htm

[5] Bart Schultz, Henry Sidgwick, Eye of the Universe: An Intellectual Biography (Cambridge University Press, 2004).

[6] For more on this matter, see Bart Schultz, "Mill, Sidgwick, Imperialism and Racism," (unpublished manuscript).

[7] See Schultz, Henry Sidgwick, Eye of the Universe, chap 8. For more about this, see my "Schultz's Sidgwick," Utilitas (forthcoming).

[8] I would like to thank Anne Skelton, Bart Schultz and John Slater for helpful comments on previous versions of this review.