Utilitarianism and the Ethics of War

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William H. Shaw, Utilitarianism and the Ethics of War, Routledge, 2016, 183pp., $44.65 (pbk), ISBN 9781138998964.

Reviewed by Nick Fotion, Emory University


The first, and shortest, portion of Shaw's book deals mainly with utilitarianism, the second with war. I follow his footsteps.

Shaw presents his rather classical portrait of utilitarianism as: 

Utilitarianism holds, first, that a state of affairs is good or bad to some degree . . . only in virtue of the well-being of the lives of particular individuals . . . Second, utilitarians believe that the good is additive. (23)

In short, utilitarianism is consequentialist and welfarist. It is also egalitarian in that it takes everyone's welfare into account. Shaw defends his favorite theory in two stages. The first has him thinking like an act-utilitarian, that is, as one who does his thinking on a case-by-case basis. What should an act-utilitarian say about a situation where a healthy patient with beautiful organs is about to be deliberately killed in order to save three others who are in need of transplant surgery? It appears that he would say "Go ahead and do it. There is more utility in saving three lives than in killing one." Shaw says, in effect, not so fast. Utility calculations are not made up just by the numbers. Concerning any action, we have to consider the good and bad consequences to the society, the hospital, other patients, etc. before rendering a judgment. If we do such an enriched analysis, the act-utilitarian would say "No, let's not do it." With examples like our hospital case, Shaw tells us that you cannot refute utilitarianism by pretending that that theory's defenders are stupid. We need to try hard to avoid committing the straw man (woman) fallacy.

The second stage of his defense has Shaw confessing that he is not really a pure act utilitarian. Here he follows what appear to be his 19th century heroes: Bentham, J. Mill, J.S. Mill, and Sidgwick. They and he have a place in their theories for rules and principles. And that place is earned by applying, of course, the general utilitarian principle. Rules and principles can themselves be shown to be utilitarian. A highway rule tells us not to drive on an expressway at speeds of 100 to 120 miles an hour. Surely, that rule satisfies the utilitarian principle. So does the rule that you should stop for a red light. In one sense, it may be that it is not utilitarian to stop at this particular red light since there is no traffic in sight in all directions. But in a larger sense, stopping is utilitarian if for no other reason than to keep drivers from making too many red-light exceptions. It looks like, then, that utilitarianism works pretty well when dealing both with individual cases and with rules and principles when they come into play. One can have his cake and eat it too.

Shaw wisely does not claim that his defensive moves show that utilitarianism is the superior theory compared to Kantian, rights-based, etc. theories. He is content to say that what he has shown is that he has a plausible theory in hand. However, late in the book, he does lapse a bit in thinking that, possibly, he has the best theory in his grasp.

When he turns to discussing war, Shaw presents us with a version of what he calls the Consequentialist War Principle (CWP):

Consequentialism entails that it is morally right for a state to wage war if and only if nothing else it could do would have better results. (47)

He then turns to what he calls the Utilitarian War Principle. This is the principle that does most of the work for him.

(UWP) It is morally right for a state to wage war if and only if no other course of action available to it has greater expected well-being, otherwise, waging war is wrong. (47)

Shaw defends his UWP against the charge, a typical one, that it leads to counterintuitive conclusions. In this connection, he gives special attention to David Rodin's claim that our intuitions tell us that World War II was a good war, yet utilitarianism cannot explain why this is so. After all, Rodin notes, there were fifty-five million people killed in that war. How can utilitarianism (UWP) overcome that horrific number so it can say that WWII was a good war?

Shaw begins his reply by saying that you cannot judge utilitarianism without taking account of the options available to the Allies. One option they had was to not resist Nazi aggression. That option would have had its costs just as the war option did. So one cannot charge all of the fifty-five million deaths to the war option. Many (maybe more) Jews and others would have died even if there had been no war. But beyond that, the assessment of the goodness or badness of that war must also include what effects of not resisting the Nazis would have had on the physical welfare of the conquered people (how many would have been exploited, arrested, tortured and killed), the psychological dispositions of those who survived, the effects on the cultures, on the political lives of these people, etc. Were one to make all of these calculations, it is obvious, Shaw thinks, that utilitarianism could indeed explain the goodness (of a bad situation to be sure) of WWII. In short, utilitarianism can explain what it supposedly cannot explain.

Having given a favorable account of his Utilitarian War Principle, Shaw argues that there is a need for a set of more detailed principles (or rules). Those in charge of deciding whether and when to send their nation to war cannot help but find it difficult to make decisions that rest on a very abstract (and thus difficult to interpret) principle. Luckily, history has given us a set of principles to help us. It is called Just War Theory. The first part of that theory, dealing directly with going or not going to war, carries the label of justice of the war (jus ad bellum). Its principles are not equivalent to UWP, but they do guide in ways that are very close to how the UWP guides. So the justice of the war principles can be appealed to in place of UWP for "pragmatic" reasons.

Shaw's characterization of the justice of the war principles follows tradition fairly well. A brief characterization (mine, not Shaw's) follows:

1. Legitimate Authority. Certain officials of a society form a monopoly when it comes to deciding when a nation will go to war. This monopoly prevents wars from proliferating, and thus tends to support the well-being that utilitarians favor.

2. Just Cause. A nation must have good (moral) reasons for going to war. The major good reasons the theory identifies are that: a) an enemy is committing or has recently committed a major form of aggression against the nation; b) an enemy is committing or has committed aggression against an ally of that nation and/or c) there is a serious humanitarian problem in another land that can be dealt with only by a military response.

3. Right Intention. Military action must satisfy the just cause even after the war is over. Bad intentions would be manifested in a war if a military "liberated" a nation from its enemy and then added that nation to its own collection of colonies.

4. Last Resort. Wars have so many bad consequences that it is utilitarian to take a whole series of steps short of war before starting war.

5. Proportionality. "Even if a state's cause is just, for the war to be just the good which is at stake must outweigh the evils the war will cause to all sides, combatants and non-combatants." (67)

The Just War Theory tradition also gives us principles to guide us all as to how a war is to be fought once it starts. These are the justice in the war (jus in bello) principles. There are three:

1. Principle of Necessity. "Force and violence are to be employed only if they serve some legitimate military goal." (101)

2. Principle of Proportionality. "The use of force or violence must be proportional to the value of the military objective being sought." (102)

3. Principle of Discrimination and Non-combatant Immunity. "Belligerents must discriminate between military and non-military targets. They are not to target non-combatants and must make reasonable efforts to avoid harming them." (102)

I focus on the Principle of Discrimination (and one other topic related to that principle) since Shaw and most other thinkers in the field treat this principle as the most important in the group. Unfortunately, the principle is both more complicated than it appears and thus more difficult to apply. I start with some easy examples.

Children, mothers, grandmothers and grandfathers are non-combatants. So also are community religious leaders, community doctors, bakers, shoe-sales people, and the like. The Principle of Discrimination clearly forbids attacking these people intentionally. No matter what theoretical baggage one brings to a discussion of the principle, everyone is in agreement here. Where disagreement arises is at the margins. Are there, it might be asked, exceptions to the application of this principle? Historically, non-utilitarians (e.g., rights-based theorists) have accused utilitarians of being soft and thus allowing for too many exceptions. Apparently, there are some (many?) situations where a military could calculate that well-being would be maximized by attacking civilians. These attacks might actually shorten the war and so save lives in the long run.

Shaw argues that calculations such as these do not tell the full utilitarian story. That story involves taking account of the reactions of the attackers. Even if they have a strong moral character that keeps them from attacking non-combatants, the exceptions they make will gradually weaken their character. In addition, their exceptions will suggest to others that they too can make exceptions even, perhaps, when they are not fully informed about their enemy's casualty calculations. These are all bad consequences, even though they are secondary to those based just on a faulty count of war casualties. So we have here a real slippery slope favoring increased aggression that Shaw wants us to avoid:

Now, as I have urged, utilitarianism itself contends that we should inculcate in combatants a blanket opposition to targeting civilians. Respect for civilian immunity should be a firm, virtually absolute part of their intuitive moral code; it is not something to be followed only on a case-by-case basis. (131)

Although he doesn't say much about prisoners and the wounded, I would presume that he would give blanket coverage to these soldiers as well. Other settings pose more problems for utilitarians (and everyone else). One side is attacking a village full of enemy soldiers and non-combatants. This is even a more difficult setting if that side's military is also under attack. Shaw grasps the fact that when soldiers fight, they will unavoidably kill some non-combatants. To disengage or to fail to fight is to act like a pacifist, and Shaw is no pacifist.

Shaw's problem, then, is to show how a utilitarian would respond to such situations. Well, clearly well-being would suffer if a military attacked indiscriminately. Other things being equal, more killing means less well-being. But how discriminating should a military be? There is really no clear-cut answer, only a general guideline:

However great a risk an army should take to avoid harming its own citizens and however much collateral harm it should tolerate when its own citizens are at stake, this is the same degree of risk it should take, and the same amount of harm it should permit, when it comes to the civilians of allied countries of neutral, and also of enemy countries. (139)

This is a pretty high standard. But it is consistent with utilitarian thinking that we engage as little as possible in activity that doesn't promote well-being. Shaw's pursuit of utilitarian thinking appears to be relentless.

The following is a general suggestion concerning the nature of his relentless pursuit. Shaw probably could have explained his pursuit more cleanly, and so more clearly, had he explicitly used Hare's distinction (Moral Thinking, Oxford, 1981) between critical and "intuitive" (what I call non-critical) thinking. The latter is thinking we do with accepted rules and principles. That is the domain of most rights claims and duties and so the domain where rights- and duty-based thinkers spend most of their time. The former is the level of thinking where we raise serious questions about our rules and principles. It is on this level where we do most of our utilitarian thinking. Shaw alludes to Hare's distinction in several places, and in a glancing way discusses it late in his relentless pursuit, but does not ever quite nail it down. (145)

Using this distinction makes it easier to understand why an appeal to utility (the state of well-being) on the critical level is more basic than an appeal to the rights of civilians, duties of soldiers, practices and ethos of the military, family values, etc. on the "intuitive" level. By not appealing to the distinction, those who oppose utilitarianism suppose that their appeal to rights, for example, is on the same level as the appeal to utility and so is often in direct conflict with utilitarianism. Without the distinction, or one like it, one is prone to make big mistakes such as coming to believe that utilitarianism cannot deal with rights appeals.

I might just mention in closing that Shaw has an interesting discussion of the currently hot issue in military ethics: "the moral equality of combatants." Jeff McMahan argues that if one side in the war is an aggressor, there is no moral equality. The victim nation has a right to shoot at the aggressor's soldiers, but the aggressor's soldiers have no right to shoot back. They may actually shoot back, but that is another matter. It seems to follow from what McMahan says that since Rommel fought for an aggressor nation and so had no right to shoot at the British Empire forces, he was a kind of criminal who could do no right in the war. Thus, if he had refused Hitler's orders to shoot prisoners (he did refuse), he could not have received moral credit for being "a nice guy." Shaw, and I as well, think this is wrong. Even if Rommel worked for Hitler, we still would have wanted him to follow the jus in bello principles. We want to give him moral credit for having been a nice guy, and do so for utilitarian reasons. Praising him at the time might have encouraged other German officers to act in same the way, and so to maximize well­-being.

Shaw's book deserves praise for several reasons. It is reader-friendly, well researched, organized, and argued. Most importantly it reminds us that although utilitarianism has been assassinated repeatedly both recently and in the past, miraculously, it is still alive and well.