Utopia of Understanding: Between Babel and Auschwitz

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Donatella Ester Di Cesare, Utopia of Understanding: Between Babel and Auschwitz, Niall Keane (tr.), SUNY Press, 2013, 260pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438442525.

Reviewed by Theodore George, Texas A&M University


The appearance in English of Donatella Ester Di Cesare's Utopia of Understanding: Between Babel and Auschwitz brings a distinctive development within the philosophical study of hermeneutics to an Anglophone readership. Although her project in this book is broad in scope, her concerns coalesce around an original approach to the notion of understanding. Her argument may be grasped as an attempt to build on but also challenge and even move beyond the 'ontological turn' in the tradition of hermeneutics associated with Martin Heidegger and Hans-Georg Gadamer.[1] For those, who accept the terms of this turn, hermeneutics no longer centers on the so-called 'art' of understanding or on epistemological considerations of our cognitive ability to understand. Rather, hermeneutics comes to treat understanding in an ontological register as the characteristically human availability, or, openness, to the being of those beings, with which we find ourselves involved. In this, understanding is a form of enactment (Vollziehung) that brings into focus the being of whatever we are involved with and thereby allows us to achieve a relation with being as such.

Di Cesare's project is distinguished within current debate by her perspective on the finitude of understanding. She develops this perspective through the interpretation of the role played in understanding by language. Indeed, Di Cesare suggests that her project is aligned with Gadamer's shift to questions of language in his efforts to grapple with the consequences of the ontological turn he inherits from Heidegger. She takes her point of departure from Gadamer's idea that understanding is first able to relate to being through the medium of language. She stresses, however, that although language thus grants us access to being, language itself is, in principle, unable to establish any definitive or final determination of what is. Thus, the pursuit of understanding through the medium of language never fully confirms our belonging to being, but also always exposes a displacement, diremption, or disruption in our relation to being. Decisive for Di Cesare, however, is that such displacement is not cause for despair; rather, it reveals that understanding is always oriented toward the exteriority, or otherness, of future possibilities to understand.

Di Cesare's title may mislead the reader unless it is grasped in terms of her concern for the finitude of understanding. By 'utopia of understanding,' she does not have in mind an ideal community of absolute comprehension defined against the deficiencies of reality. Rather, for her, 'utopia' concerns the future that remains beyond the horizons of either the reality that exists already or even the reality that can as yet be anticipated or imagined. In this way, she associates the 'utopia of understanding' with the impetus that spurs understanding toward a place of shared comprehension that can never be made actual but that nevertheless remains possible as always still to come. Utopian in this sense, understanding hovers between the Tower of Babel, a place of absolute comprehension that thus forecloses all further possibilities of meaning, and Auschwitz, as she has it, a modern Tower of Babel that aims to enforce comprehensibility through the absolute negation of the impetus of understanding to address the other and be addressed by the other.

Di Cesare presents her interpretation not by means of a rigidly linear argument but rather through a series of attempts to expose limits that confront us in the experience of language. She addresses a number of centers of gravity in current debate: the bequest of Heidegger and Gadamer, the hermeneutics of translation, the hermeneutical implications of poetry, and, indeed, these implications as epitomized by the poetry of Paul Celan, as well as the relationship between hermeneutics and deconstruction. Di Cesare, however, also foregrounds figures and themes that are of clear significance for philosophical hermeneutics but that remain underrepresented in scholarly discussion in the field. She devotes serious attention to German Romantic hermeneutics and to themes in Jewish hermeneutics as developed by figures such as Franz Rosenzweig and Walter Benjamin. She also recognizes the significant hermeneutical consequences of themes from Jewish heritages of thought and gives important expression to the need for hermeneutical consideration of the horrors and legacy of the Holocaust. The complexity and richness of Di Cesare's approach may leave her open to some questions about the unity of her interpretation of language. Taken together, however, her interrelated considerations outline a distinctive vision of hermeneutics that demands serious scholarly attention and that has the potential to enhance and even change the shape of debate in the field. It should also be noted that readers of Di Cesare's book will benefit greatly from Niall Keane's translation, which is at once lucid and textured.

Chapters One and Two may be understood to provide, if not an overview of Di Cesare's position, then, in any case, some broader strokes of her idea of the relation of language and being. In Chapter One, she maintains that hermeneutics involves an "a-metaphysical dimension" because understanding is oriented by an experience of language that surpasses being (13). We encounter this excess, as she puts it at one point, in "linguisticality," an experience of language in which we are exposed to the limits of our ability to say what we mean, as, for example, when we struggle to find the right word (8). In this limit experience, language proves not to be identical with being (a position she associates with Gianni Vattimo) but, on the contrary, to exceed being insofar as the being of what is spoken of has already been given determinate shape through linguistic practice. In Chapter Two, Di Cesare expands on the notion of linguisticality to critique those in professional philosophy who reduce inquiry about language to the analysis of assertions. Based on themes in Gadamer, Heidegger, and no less in Aristotle, she suggests that such inquiry is derivative because it artificially focuses on the said in abstraction from the original experience of language as dialogue. Denouncing the supremacy of the assertion as a symptom of the requirements of modern science and technology, she argues that dialogue requires us to listen not simply to the said but more originally to the infinite possibilities of the unsaid.

Di Cesare develops her notion of the finitude of understanding in subsequent chapters with reference to a series of matters that draw out different features of the otherness with which language confronts us. While the range of Di Cesare's considerations recommends against any simple summation, some chief lines of her argument may be indicated.

In Chapter Three, Di Cesare examines the hermeneutical implications of translation. She keys her discussion, first, to the Biblical story of the Tower of Babel, and, second, to a brief history of ideas of translation in the Enlightenment, Romanticism, Heidegger, Rosenzweig and Benjamin. For her, the need for translation represents not a secondary experience of language but rather a proper and necessary response to the dispersion of given languages. She argues that the task of translation is neither merely to represent with accuracy in one's own language ideas originally expressed in another language, nor to appropriate in one's own language the foreign language that sustains the meaning of the original text. Rather, the task of translation answers a call, perhaps, as Benjamin regards it, a messianic call, to aspire to a pluralistic world of understanding through the opening up of one's own language to the foreign. Chapter Four may be said to deepen the inquiry initiated in Chapter Three with reference to the sense of the foreign that attends even the experience of one's so-called mother tongue. She develops her argument through an interpretation of the theme of exile in the Jewish heritage and the implications of this theme for German-speaking Jews in the aftermath of the Holocaust. Within this context, she suggests that even our first language exposes us to otherness as an inheritance that we are called to appropriate but that nevertheless remains always also exterior to us. Chapter Five focuses on hermeneutical implications of poetry as they may be derived from Gadamer's reading of Paul Celan. Acknowledging the concern that Gadamer does not consider Celan expressly in the context of the Holocaust or the Jewish tradition, she derives from Gadamer's reading the insight that poetry, in presenting inexhaustible possibilities of meaning, addresses us and opens a space of dialogue.

Di Cesare further contours her interpretation of the finitude of understanding in Chapter Six through a consideration of the relation of hermeneutics and deconstruction. She focuses on the philosophical engagement between Gadamer and Derrida that began with their celebrated 1981 meeting in Paris, was developed by Gadamer in subsequent writings, and was taken up again by Derrida in an address in commemoration of Gadamer's death. Those familiar with the scholarly debate that surrounds the relation between hermeneutics and deconstruction will recognize in Di Cesare's approach a fresh outlook: whereas it is by now common for scholars to insist on the distance between Gadamer and Derrida, she accentuates the proximity that informs the differences between them. She argues that Gadamer, no less than Derrida, affirms the ineluctability of rupture in all discourse; in hermeneutics, the task of understanding begins with a rupture that dissolves tacit agreement and never admits of any final closure of this breech. While Derrida accentuates the "creativity of interruption," however, Gadamer holds that every rupture elicits "uninterrupted dialogue" (163). This, finally, leads Di Cesare to reflect on Derrida's remarks about the demand that the death of the other places on us to carry such a dialogue forward.

Di Cesare returns in the final chapter to the notion of a 'utopia of understanding' first announced in her title. It should be said that her discussion is characterized by a special density, addressing issues inCelan's poetics, Auschwitz, and major themes from the Jewish heritage. One of her main ideas, though, is that the orientation of understanding toward a future always still to come may be grasped as a utopian, even revolutionary, impulse. Describing understanding as a "vital instinct" (201), she argues that one horror undergone by the prisoners of the camps was the foreclosure of any impetus to understand. In the camp, conditions prevailed that eradicated all need to address the other or to be addressed. Thus stripped of any need for interpretation or translation, all that remained for prisoners was to submit to the all too readily transparent "language of the whip" (205). By contrast, the impulse to understand is quickened by the collision with the other that thus opens the prospect of dialogue. In this, however, language never affords a permanent dwelling that would allow us to achieve complete familiarity; instead, it offers only a temporary shelter that orients us toward the possibility of a community with the other that remains always still to come.

It is not an exaggeration to claim that Di Cesare's Utopia of Understanding represents a consequential and pioneering program of research within the philosophical study of hermeneutics. Her project both depends on and expands beyond the legacy of Gadamer and others that contribute to the tradition of hermeneutics rather than simply clarifying or defending their purported positions. In this, her project may be compared to and brought into conversation with a number of recent attempts to press the philosophical study of hermeneutics in significantly new directions.[2] Although the scholarly reception of Di Cesare's book will no doubt continue to give more definition to the stakes of her project and, of course, also raise questions about her view, the originality of the contribution made by her voice cannot be missed. Her examination of the utopian visage of understanding, the limits of language that define it, the proximity she sees between hermeneutics and deconstruction, as well as the significance of themes from Jewish hermeneutics and the Jewish heritage, all do much to advance current debate.

[1] See Gadamer's discussion of "overcoming the epistemological problem though phenomenological research" in Truth and Method. Hans-Georg Gadamer, Truth and Method, Second Revised Edition, Trans. Joel Weinsheimer and Donald G. Marshall (New York: Continuum, 1995), 243 -- 264. An important assessment of Gadamer's relation to Heidegger's ontological considerations may be found in Günter Figal, Objectivity: The Hermeneutical and Philosophy, trans. Theodore George (Albany: State University of New York Press, 2010), 9ff.

[2] Here, we may think not only of Vattimo's thought, whose position Di Cesare addresses expressly in her book, but also the contributions of Günter Figal, as well as James Risser and Dennis Schmidt, among several others.