Vagueness: A Global Approach

Vagueness A Global Approach

Kit Fine, Vagueness: A Global Approach, Oxford University Press, 2020, 120pp., $31.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780197514955.

Reviewed by Roy Sorensen, University of Texas at Austin


Possibly, this is a borderline case of ‘book’. Kit Fine disagrees on the novel grounds that local indeterminacy is logically impossible (24).

Charles Saunders Peirce postulated “intrinsically uncertain cases” to define ‘vague’: “By intrinsically uncertain we mean not uncertain in consequence of any ignorance of the interpreter, but because the speaker’s habits of language were indeterminate” (1902, 748). Consider a literary historiographer who wishes to discourage search for the first book. She assembles a slippery slope of literary works that originates with definite non-books. Toward the end of the shelf are progressively better candidates for ‘book’. But none is a plausible candidate for being the first book. The exhibit illustrates a conceptual limit to inquiry. There are borderline cases of ‘book’ that expose the quest for the first book as misconceived. Whereas ordinary borderline cases of ‘book’ merely resist inquiry of an ordinary sort (opening the cover to see whether it is a fake book), absolute borderline cases resist all means of inquiry. ‘Book’ is vague by virtue of possessing absolute borderline cases (= local indeterminate cases).

Ideally, the local indeterminist points to a particular culprit, say, the conveniently titled Book?, which resists all means of classification. Epistemicists infer that ‘Book? is a book’ has a hidden truth-value. After all, the law of bivalence says that every proposition has exactly one of two truth-values, true or false.

Many-valued logicians say borderline statements are counterexamples to bivalence. Instead of having a truth-value of 1 (true) or 0 (false), ‘Book? is a book’ has an intermediate truth-value .5. To keep logic truth-functional, the many-valued logician assigns disjunctions the same value as the highest disjunct. Consequently, the law of excluded middle, Any proposition of the form ‘Either p or not p’ is true’, only works for the limit case in which p has an extreme truth-value of 1 or 0.

Supervaluationists concede the loss of bivalence but try to salvage excluded middle by rejecting truth-functionality. According to Fine’s (1975) supervaluational principle, a statement is true if it comes out true under all admissible precisifications of the vague predicate. Any classical tautology meets this requirement—including the law of excluded middle. Instead of being truth from below, this is truth from above—based on the whole language getting precisified (2020, 12). Despite this holistic lightning from 1975, the thunder of global indeterminacy will only become audible in 2020 when the background noise of local indeterminacy is silenced.

Chapter one suggests that persistent disagreement about the nature of borderline cases justifies second thoughts about whether there is any such local indeterminacy. The key second thought in chapter two is that all local indeterminists are committed to denying excluded middle. The many-valued logician deserves credit for facing up to this fact. Epistemicists stonewall with bricks of inexplicably unknowable facts shaped by classical tautologies and inference rules. Fine (1975) himself thought he could affirm the law of excluded middle. He even affirms there is a first book (even though he would have denied this is the full-throated affirmation of the epistemicists).

Fine (2020) no longer sees slack between truth and fact. The absence of wiggle room also undermines subsequent theorists who report that instead of denying ‘Either p or not p’, they are denying ‘Either definitely p or definitely not p’. According to Fine, insertion of the definite operator (or any extra-logical buffer) just changes the topic or delays denial of excluded middle or devolves into dogmatism (through epistemicist readings of the operator).

Vagueness cannot be understood by denying excluded middle! But it can be understood by denying conjunctive excluded middle. Conjunctive excluded middle says: (Either item 1 is a book or not a book) and (Either item 2 is a book or not a book) and. . . . To recognize the vagueness of a predicate is to acknowledge there is never a cut off.

Suppose the historiographer turned her slippery slope into a “forced march sorites” in which the browser is compelled to answer yes or no to ‘Is item n a book?’ Someone who thinks that vagueness is just irremediable ignorance might hope to have luckily given entirely true answers. A supervaluationist will think his forced answers at least correspond to an admissible precisification of ‘book’. But Fine (chapter 2) dismisses such hopes and consolations. Any sequence of forced answers breaches a semantic requirement to suspend judgment somewhere or other. A complete response is like removing the bubble from a level.

Since conjunctive excluded middle is a theorem of classical logic, Fine offers a compatibility logic for vague statements that bears a family resemblance to intuitionism. The resemblance has a generative basis. Fine shows how to understand his compatibility semantics as a modification of Saul Kripke’s semantics for intuitionistic logic (41).

With hindsight, Fine thinks the historiographer succeeded in demonstrating the vagueness of ‘book’ without relying upon any locally indeterminate cases of ‘book’. She could do no more than demonstrate the boundarylessness of ‘book’.

Consider a believer in local indeterminacy who tries to further corroborate the vagueness of ‘book’ by singling out an absolute borderline case of ‘book’ from the soritical shelf. According to Fine, this localist resembles a boy who tries to demonstrate that there is a misshelved book by taking it from a shelf and presenting it in isolation. ‘Misshelved’ is not an intrinsic property of the book.

The relationality of ‘borderline book’ is easy to miss because there is no explicit reference to the relatum. Just as ‘heavy book’ is relative to a local gravitational field despite making no mention of it, ‘borderline book’ is relative to a series despite making no explicit reference to a range of cases. When I affirm Book? is a borderline book, I affirm nothing about a range. The inexplicit nature of the relationality explains why ‘borderline’ is presumed to be akin to ‘mass’ and only, with the help of logical investigation, revealed to be as relational as ‘weight’.

While on the soritical shelf, a book in the middle of the range is a top-down borderline case. This borderline book is akin to the apparent puddle on a hot road. The “puddle” is really refracted blue sky. The bottom-up indeterminacy is a mirage that deceives most commentators on vagueness, “perhaps even all” (24).

Contextualists have previously spotted the anomaly of forced march sorites arguments that lack definite borderline cases:

Sorensen Fine Gestalt Trapezoid

The definitely square-ish figure on the left is linked by intermediates to the definitely triangle-ish figure on the right. But none of the intermediates is a stable borderline case. Once you see a figure as triangle-ish, you can no longer see its predecessor as square-ish. The predecessor is taken along for the ride. This instability prevents you from identifying any figure as the last square-ish figure. There is no stable suspension of judgment for any figure. Yet the range of cases is stably understood as vague.

According to gestalt psychologists, memory economizes by representing most shapes as modifications of ideal shapes such as square and triangle. Instead of having thousands of names for each trapezoid, it labels just the extreme members and interpolate to other figures with precise modifiers—or vague hedges such as the suffix ‘-ish’. A side-effect of this mental economy is that intermediate shapes are unstable. You must judge the first shape as square-ish and the last as not square-ish. But if you judge any figure as square-ish you must judge the next figure as square-ish. This is a forced march sorites. So, there is vagueness. Yet we cannot trace the vagueness to a specific figure that is borderline square-ish. When we focus on a specific candidate, we either picture it sandwiched between two square-ish figures or two triangle-ish figures.

A speaker using a vague predicate F is obliged to de dicto suspend judgment on some case or other (de dicto suspension: OS(∃x)Fx). But there is no case such that they are obliged to suspend judgment de re (de re suspension: (∃x)OSFx). The certainty holist criticizes Rene Descartes’ method of universal doubt on the ground that doubt is only possible against a background of certainty. The suspension holist espouses the photographic negative: certainty is only possible against a background of doubt. To grasp a vague concept is to contrast verdicts with suspended judgments. There is no specific proposition upon which one must suspend judgment. But grasp of a vague concept requires suspension on some case or other. There is no requirement that a competent speaker stick to the same suspensions between interviews. When speaking under administrative norms, the speaker ought to immobilize this restless suspension with a rule that makes any shoulder shrugging predictable. But this is an exogenous imposition of consistency.

The local indeterminist replies that figures that raise the possibility of global indeterminacy without local indeterminacy do not entail it. The denial of any definite borderline case is compatible with their definite presence in a range of cases. From a distance, the localist spots a copy of Fine’s Reasoning with Arbitrary Objects sandwiched between two copies of his Semantic Relationism. That puts her in a position to know that at least one of the two copies is misshelved even though she is not in a position to know which. Similarly, she knows (with the help of excluded middle) that at least one figure in the trapezoid sequence is a borderline case of ‘square-ish’ without being in a position to know which.

Contextualists appeal to a variety of psychological mechanisms to explain the absence of definite borderline cases. Diana Raffman (2014, 139–146) focuses on hysteresis—a kind of inertia. Your car’s transmission will shift to second gear at 20 miles per hour but will shift back down to first gear at 15 miles per hour. Changes are an expense and are therefore minimized. To know whether the car is in second gear at 18 miles per hour, you need to know the car’s past. Hysteresis affects many psychological phenomena including sorting judgments. If you begin with square-ish figures proceeding (left to right), you will flip later than if you began with triangle-ish figures (proceeding right to left).

Early contextualists tried to spare the sorter from inconsistency by attributing an inevitable shift of context. Hysteresis just makes the speaker inevitably equivocal. The forced march sorites is impossible to execute because the soldiers cannot univocally obey orders.

The sorites monger can work around hysteresis by randomizing presentation of premises, preventing context shifts with stabilizing anaphoric devices, and other techniques. Diana Raffman (2015) now justifies the irregularity of speakers on practical grounds. Vague words are unruly. They have meta-rules that forbid the sort of complete rules that govern precise words. The mandatory incompleteness of vague words ensures that speakers diverge (or only converge for causes other than rule following). Raffman wields her contextualist psychology to show that the sorites paradox can be dissolved without revising classical logic.

Fine thinks the sorites paradox does require revision of classical logic. He avoids any mention of psychology by defining global indeterminacy solely in terms of his new quantified first order logic. From Fine’s logical point of view, the contextualists detect holistic patterns that are deeper than their appeal to hysteresis, gestalt switches, response dependence, indexicality, and so forth. Logic screens off the contextualists’ social science data in the way that mathematics screens off the linguists’ data supporting Zipf’s law (that a word’s frequency varies inversely with its length). Benoit Mandelbrot proved that Zipf’s law holds for texts produced by a wide variety of processes—even if we take an English text and designate ‘e’ as the space between the resulting “words”. So Zipf’s law tells us nothing distinctive about human language. If Fine’s compatibility semantics works, it works for language users that lack our cognitive architecture.

Global indeterminacy is modeled up from forced march sorites arguments (in two equivalent ways, from state descriptions and from denial of conjunctive excluded middle). But once we have the idea, we can speculate about global indeterminacy that does not give rise to the forced marches. Consider a book bin that shelves books spine up. The browser looking down at the row notices that half of the books are upside-down relative to the other half. Half the books are misshelved but nothing settles which half that is. The analogy between vagueness and misshelving suggests there could be vagueness without any definite cases that can trigger a forced march sorites.

In chapter three, echoes of the forced march can be heard in Fine’s objections to Timothy Williamson’s iterative arguments concerning luminosity. Fine applies his compatibility semantics to developing variants of the margin for error principle that are less serviceable mortars for his epistemicist fortress. Fine reinvigorates an old, ironical suspicion that Williamson uses soritical arguments to support the margin for error principle central to his diagnosis of the sorites paradox.

As the book closes with personal identity, I expected a telescopic application to spectrum cases in which one person blends into another. But Fine instead turns a microscope to fission cases. Instead of having a range of many cases, we have a single man, Primo, who splits into Lefty and Righty. Fine applies his compatibility semantics to relax us into saying Lefty and Righty are distinct while denying that Primo thereby ceases to exist. Primo is not distinct from Lefty and not distinct from Righty. We need not press further because there is no further.

The low population of the fission case explains why Fine set such a low quota in chapter one: “Global indeterminacy, in contrast, is indeterminacy in the application of the predicate to a range of cases. The term ‘range’ is important here, we have not a single case, but a number of cases, two at the very least” (18).

Now I wonder why Fine went as high as two. Define a lonely object as one that does not coexist with any contingent object wholly distinct from it. The absence of other objects makes the object lonely. Consequently, the borderline absence of others makes the object borderline lonely. This scenario suffices to show that ‘lonely’ is vague. It does so by carefully avoiding the implication that there are at least two objects.

Suppose a gardener finds a carrot with a well-developed shoot. One carrot or two? If there are no other carrots in the domain of discourse, the carrot is borderline lonely. A second source of loneliness is quantificational. Suppose carrots grow beneath a fence marking the transition to a neighbor’s yard. There is no telling whether these fence-sitting carrots are in the gardener’s domain of discourse.

Borderline cases of ‘lonely’ make an endogenous demand on themselves (Don’t definitely be more than one!) and an exogenous demand on everything else (Do not definitely exist!). Consequently, this vagueness cannot be modeled with a range requirement that requires at least two objects.

Fine might try to meet the quota of two objects by counting indeterminately existing objects as objects. Or he might just to classify ‘lonely’ as having a third kind of indeterminacy. Fine is only denying local indeterminacy and making a compensating affirmation of global indeterminacy. He is not committed to the exhaustivity of the local/global distinction. A virtue of this book is that it raises the possibility of vagueness beyond the localist’s range of vision.


Fine, Kit. 1975, “Vagueness, truth and logic,” Synthese, 54: 235–59.

Fine, Kit. 2020. Vagueness: A Global Approach. New York: Oxford University Press.

Peirce, C.S., 1902. “Vague”, in Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology, J.M. Baldwin (ed.), New York: MacMillan.

Raffman, Diana. 2014. Unruly Words: A Study of Vague Language. New York: Oxford University Press.