Vagueness and Contradiction

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Sorensen, Roy, Vagueness and Contradiction, Oxford University Press, 2001, 200pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199241309.

Reviewed by JC Beall, University of Connecticut


According to epistemicists vagueness is nothing but an epistemic matter: there is no objective indeterminacy. Though by now a familiar position, epistemicism continues to strike contemporary philosophers as implausible. (There is a last second of one’s childhood. There was a first second at which Buddha became a fat man. And so on.) Sorensen’s Vagueness and Contradiction aims to address the incredulity with which epistemicism is commonly greeted.

My aim in this review is two-fold. First, I indicate the structure of the book by swiftly describing the aims of each chapter. Second, I indicate what I think is the chief defect of the book. I conclude with a brief overall evaluation of the book. I should note that throughout the review I assume familiarity with epistemicism, either in the form discussed by Timothy Williamson (Vagueness Routledge: 1994) or in Sorensen’s earlier book (Blindspots Oxford University Press: 1988) of which his Vagueness and Contradiction is a sort of sequel.

1 Structure of the Book

The chief aim of Sorensen’s book is not to argue for epistemicism nor explain the ignorance that it posits—ignorance of boundaries, which, according to Sorensen, is insurmountable in cases of “absolute borderline cases” (see § 1.2 below). Sorensen’s chief aim, as above, is to explain why so many philosophers, including Sorensen himself, find epistemicism to be so incredible. His explanation, in the end, naturally draws on our psychology: we are prone to

“round off insignificant differences”. Given this tendency, we (qua competent speakers) are inclined to accept so-called tolerance conditionals, for example ‘If n is small, then n + 1 is small’. What is important to note is that, according to Sorensen, English itself warrants the acceptance of such conditionals: any competent speaker will accept them. The trouble is that, given classical logic, such conditionals entail falsehoods: From the conjunction of all tolerance conditionals of the form ‘If n is a small number, then n +1 is a small number’, one gets (via transitivity) the a priori falsehood:

(1) If 1 is small then 100 billion is small.

Sentence (1), according to Sorensen, is an a priori absurdity, by which he means that it is (a priori) necessarily false. Hence, the negation of (1), given classical logic (or a suitable modal extension), is an a priori truth (a tautology). The upshot is that at least one of the tolerance conditionals in a typical sorites argument is (analytically) false; however, given English and our psychological makeup, we are inclined—indeed, compelled, as Sorensen says—to accept it.

No doubt one detects a whiff of inconsistency. This is all to Sorensen’s point. According to Sorensen we are compelled to believe contradictions given that we are compelled to believe all tolerance conditionals and the negations of some of their consequences. (We are compelled to believe that if n is small then n +1 is small. But, as above, the conjunction of such beliefs entails (1), the negation of which we are equally compelled to believe.) For good measure, Sorensen points out that we are compelled to believe infinitely many contradictions, given the existence of infinitely many (analytic) sorites arguments.

In a nutshell, then, the explanation of our incredulity is that it is unavoidable: Given English and our hard wiring, we are compelled to accept all tolerance conditionals; hence, epistemicism, which claims that some of those conditionals are false, is very, very difficult to believe. Despite the difficulty, Sorensen maintains that epistemicism is the only viable response to vagueness, unless one wishes to take one of the “radical” lines that require deviation from classical logic (or one of its conservative extensions).

Of course, Sorensen’s arguments are much subtler (and entertaining) than I have indicated here. Nonetheless, his basic position is as I’ve described, resting entirely on a firm commitment to classical logic—a point to which I will return in § 2. In what follows, I give only a very swift indication of the role of Sorensen’s chapters.

1.1 Introduction

The introduction sets out Sorensen’s basic argument for epistemicism, which turns on a more basic argument for “sharp boundaries”. The latter argument is short and worth quoting (though I omit various qualifications of context, which for present purposes are unimportant). Sorensen writes (p.1)

[Commitment to sharp boundaries is] imposed by boring beliefs, in particular, allegiance to lightweight common sense and textbook logic. (Logicians marvel at how small a dose of each is sufficient.) Given this modest degree of intellectual conservatism, the ancient sorites paradox corners me into the belief that all vague terms are sensitive to arbitrarily small differences:
Base step: a collection of one million grains of sand is a heap.
Induction step: if a collection of n grains of sand is a heap, then so is a collection of n-1 grains.
Conclusion: a collection of one grain of sand is a heap.
The argument is valid by mathematical induction… . Therefore, my only recourse is to reject the induction step.
… But the matter is not so painless. If I reject the induction step, I thereby accept its negation. The negation is true only if there is a value for n such that n grains of sand is a heap and n +1 grains is not a heap. In other words, there must be a sharp threshold at which an eroding heap turns into a non-heap. Ouch!

And therein lies the hard-to-believe thesis. The epistemicist maintains that the place of the borderline (as it were) is something of which we are ignorant; and if, with Sorensen, one grants “absolute borderline cases”, such ignorance is forever with us. The task of the remaining chapters, as above, is to address the incredulity that accompanies this thesis.

1.2 Absolute Borderline Cases

Sorensen argues for what he calls absolute borderline cases, which he distinguishes from relative borderline cases. This distinction nicely distinguishes Sorensen’s project from that of Williamson (another well-known epistemicist), whose explanatory project focuses only on relative borderline cases. Relative borderline cases involve an ignorance that is relative to some system of cognition (human, for example); absolute borderline cases involve an ignorance that is not relative to any such system. With the distinction in hand, Sorensen claims that only absolute borderline cases constitute vagueness, a claim that sits well with many theorists but is at odds with Williamson’s version of epistemicism. (Part of Sorensen’s argument for absolute borderline cases is discussed in the final chapter, briefly described in §1.11 below.)

1.3 Forced Analytical Error

This chapter carries on the case for absolute borderlines and, in particular, the identification of vagueness with non-relative (absolute) borderline cases. This chapter also contains direct criticism of Williamson’s version of epistemicism and the popular supervaluational approaches.

1.4 Inconsistent Machines

This chapter sketches an epistemological framework in which there are rationally mandatory inconsistent beliefs. In developing this framework Sorensen points to difficulties with rival notions of (in-)coherence.

1.5 Sainsbury's Spectra and Penroses's Triangle

This chapter continues the theme of its immediate predecessor; it sketches some of the psychological details that accompany rationally compelled inconsistency. Sorensen gives arguments to show that contemporary views about the modularity of mind afford room for the sort of “inconsistent language use” with which he is concerned—the a priori judgments concerning tolerance conditionals.

1.6 Does Apriority Agglomerate?

The preceding two chapters sketch a framework in which rationally compelled (a priori) inconsistent beliefs arise. The aim of this chapter is to show that, contrary to some, inconsistent a priori beliefs are conceptually possible. Sorensen defends a conception of a prioricity which sits well with “naturalism” and, in turn, affords a nice argument against the so-called agglomeration principle concerning a prioricity, according to which a conjunction is a priori if each of its conjuncts is a priori (where the ‘if… then… ‘ is a classical material conditional).

1.7 Analytic Sorites and the Cheshire Cat

The preceding chapter defends a notion of a prioricity that purports to sit well with “naturalism”. The defense, however, does not shy away from intensionality. Aware of Quine’s still influential attacks on intensionality—and in particular the intensional circle of analyticity, necessity, and a prioricity—Sorensen recasts his overall results in Quine-friendly fashion. In some sense, this chapter marks the end of Sorensen’s main project—the task of explaining why epistemicism strikes so many philosophers (including Sorensen himself) as incredible. But Sorensen’s overall arguments and explanations turn heavily on an externalism about content. As he points out, some philosophers may accept many of his arguments but nonetheless take the conclusions to be a reductio of his externalism. Accordingly, Sorensen sets about to show that many of his main points—including, in particular, that competent speakers are compelled to believe many inconsistencies—follow even on internalist grounds. This task is taken up in the next three chapters.

1.8 Believing the Impossible

This chapter gives another argument for the possibility of believing impossible claims. The aim, as above, is to show that such a conclusion need not turn on externalist constraints.

1.9 Reason Demands Belief in Infinitely Many Contradictions

Again, this is another argument for the next critical thesis in Sorensen’s overall explanation of our incredulity concerning epistemicism: he argues for the thesis indicated by the chapter title, but does so without presupposing externalism about content.

1.10 The Viral Theory of Inconsistency

This chapter finishes off the (first-person) argument presented in the previous chapter. The argument turns on Godel’s limitative theorems and, of course, classical logic.

1.11 The Truthmaker Gaps

The previous chapter closes the review for internalists (as it were). The point of this chapter is to address an independent worry about epistemicism arising out of the correspondence theory of truth, which, as Sorensen notes, seems to be inhospitable to epistemicism—calling for “a substantial fact that would make, say, 15 after noon the last noonish minute” (165). Sorensen shows how a suitable truthmaker thesis affords room (indeed, has as a consequence) absolute borderline cases.

2 A Criticism

Sorensen’s arguments are well crafted and entertaining, and his main project—addressing the noted incredulity—is an important one. My chief criticism of the book is its starting point: the assumption of classical (first-order) logic. If one shares Sorensen’s unwavering commitment to classical logic (and only classical logic), then his overall explanation of the incredulity that confronts epistemicism may be satisfying. By my lights, however, Sorensen has started one step ahead of the target: by simply assuming that classical logic is non-negotiable, Sorensen has failed to address the incredulity he wishes to address. I will say (only) a few words about this.

Everybody agrees that if classical logic is non-negotiable, then epistemicism is the best response to the sorites (and vagueness, generally). But, then, why does everybody find epistemicism so incredible? The answer, I would think, arises precisely from the lack of unwavering commitment to classical logic. If this is right, then Sorensen’s book will not achieve its aim: it will convince only those with a prior, unwavering commitment to classical logic. In some areas of philosophy, classical logic is a safe assumption; but in the philosophy of language (and in particular the paradoxes), it is not.

Consider the classical “law of non-contradiction”, according to which no sentence is both true and false. (I use this example because Sorensen has things to say about non-contradiction in the course of his overall argument.) To be sure, most philosophers are strongly committed to non-contradiction, so formulated. But how did this principle gain the status of a “law”? Presumably, it gained the status of a law because nobody could think of counterexamples. But what if you were squarely looking at a Liar-like sentence, ‘This sentence is false’? Does the proposed “law” appear to be as obvious? Hardly. The point here is not that we have a counterexample to non-contradiction; the point is that logical theory itself depends on the expressive resources of our language; logical theory itself depends on the apparent linguistic phenomena, of which the paradoxes are examples.

This is not the place to explore the methodology of logic—the methods by which we arrive at correct logical theory(-ies). My chief criticism of Sorensen’s book is that without explaining the need for an unwavering commitment (only) to classical logic, the book fails to address its target audience: the many philosophers to whom epistemicism is incredible. As above, most philosophers will agree that if we are bound to (only) classical logic, then epistemicism is the

best response to the sorites (give or take very few pragmatic responses that might be candidates). But most philosophers take epistemicism to be incredible because few take themselves to be bound (only) to classical logic.

3 Overall Evaluation

Despite the remarks in § 2, Sorensen’s book is well worth reading. His version of epistemicism is a more robust version than Williamson’s, and his arguments for being rationally compelled towards inconsistency are important and interesting in themselves. (Such arguments do seem to show the consequences of classical logic and what I called “Fregean principles of acceptance and rejection”.) Anyone working in the philosophy of language will benefit from reading the book; and anyone working on the paradoxes must read the book. I strongly recommend the book as a central text for classes in the philosophy of language (at either the undergraduate or graduate level).

2 A Criticism