Vagueness in Context

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Stewart Shapiro, Vagueness in Context, Oxford, 2006, 226pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199280398.

Reviewed by Matti Eklund, Cornell University


Stewart Shapiro's new book is an extended defense of his theory of vagueness. The theory is centered on four key theses: contextualism about vagueness; the "principle of tolerance"; the thesis that borderline sentences are response-dependent; and the idea of open texture. The book is full of ideas. Apart from discussing his main ideas on vagueness and presenting a novel formal framework designed to respect these ideas, Shapiro discusses the role of logic in the study of natural language; vagueness and abstraction principles; how to apply Crispin Wright's cruces of realism (1992, 2004) to discussions of the objectivity of vague discourse; and Friedrich Waismann's thesis of open texture. This richness in ideas is both the book's major strength and its major weakness. It makes for an interesting read. At the same time, many of the ideas remain undeveloped, and Shapiro devotes less attention to relevant background, and to objections that may be raised, than one would like. Given how the book plunges straight into the issues, it can only really be recommended to researchers and graduate students with special interest in the topics discussed; the book would not provide a helpful introduction to the issues for a newcomer.

Chapter one lays out the basic elements of the proposed theory of vagueness. Chapter two discusses the role of model theory. Chapters three and four develop the model theory. Chapter five deals with the problem of higher-order vagueness. Chapters six and seven deal with various further issues; notable among them vagueness and abstraction principles and also an attempt to deal with the question of whether there is vagueness in the world by appeal to Wright's cruces of realism. The book ends with an appendix on Waismann on open texture and analyticity.

I will focus in this review on what I take to be Shapiro's main philosophical claims about vagueness. An equally large part of the book is devoted to developing a formal framework, but I will focus on the underlying philosophical motivation. Let me start by briefly describing what I take to be Shapiro's main claims.

(i) Contextualism about vagueness is the view that vague expressions are characteristically context-sensitive and that recognizing this somehow provides the key to the puzzles of vagueness. Among the theorists who can be regarded as defenders of contextualism are, besides Shapiro, Hans Kamp (1981), Jamie Tappenden (1993), Diana Raffman (1994), Scott Soames (1999), and Delia Graff (2000). One reason for skepticism about contextualism is that, even if it is true that vague expressions are context-sensitive, the problems that attach to vague expressions like 'tall' when their context-sensitivity is not taken into account seem to remain even when it is. Thus, even when we focus on a particular context of use, it appears absurd that there should be a sharp boundary between what 'tall' applies to and what it does not; the problems of higher-order vagueness are equally serious here; etc. More on this later. For now I just want to register that one might initially be skeptical concerning the helpfulness of appeal to context, even if vague expressions as a rule, or even always, are context-sensitive.

Shapiro's contextualism, I should stress, is of a rather special kind. Two potentially controversial distinctions play a role in the discussion. The first is that between 'external' context -- what is fixed by external factors such as "comparison class, paradigm cases, contrasting cases, etc." (33) -- and the context simpliciter, which also comprises decisions made by speakers regarding how to decide borderline cases. This distinction is tied to Shapiro's understanding of determinate truth: a sentence is determinately true as used in a given context if and only if its meaning plus the external factors of this context determine it as true. Second, Shapiro, following Raffman, insists that his contextualist thesis concerns the extensions and not the meanings of vague predicates (42). (I must confess, though, that it remains unclear to me just how Shapiro conceives of this latter distinction.)

(ii) Shapiro's principle of tolerance is the following:

Suppose that two objects a, a′ in the field of P differ only marginally in the relevant respect (on which P is tolerant). Then if one competently judges a to have P, then she cannot competently judge a′ in any other manner. (8)

It is clear from the surrounding discussion that Shapiro would add the qualification "… without changing the context".

(iii) As for the response-dependence of borderline sentences, this claim (which, like the contextualism, Shapiro takes straight from Raffman) is usefully separated into two. First, there is the claim that the principle

(B) An item is F if and only if the relevant competent subject(s) would judge it to be F. (37; I have modified the wording slightly for convenience)

is true of most vague and other predicates (with suitable qualifications, as Shapiro mentions). Second, there is the claim that for borderline items being classified, the dependence is right-to-left.

(iv) The principle of open texture, finally, says that "[T]he rules of language use, as they are fixed by what we say and do, allow someone to go either way" with respect to borderline cases (10). Relating this back to the distinction between external and internal context, the idea is that for all that is determined by meaning plus external context still some unsettled cases remain, and with respect to them someone can, in Shapiro's words, go either way. The idea of open texture comes originally from Friedrich Waismann (the book includes a separate Appendix on Waismann on open texture). Crispin Wright introduced into the sorites literature the idea that speakers can permissibly go either way with respect to borderline cases. Shapiro takes Wright to subscribe to the open texture thesis he describes. I will later turn to the relation between what Shapiro says and Wright's published views on the matter.

Given how central these four theses are to Shapiro's book, there is surprisingly little by way of direct argument for them, and surprisingly little by way of discussion of the objections to them that can be found in various parts of the literature. Presumably, Shapiro's idea is that the proof is in the pudding: the attractiveness of the resulting theory of vagueness is argument enough.

Putting the theses together, here is the picture that we seem to get. (I will below express some doubts.) Vague expressions are context-sensitive. For F, a vague predicate, there are some objects such that F applies to them in some contexts but not in others. Moreover, even given the external context, it is not the case that the truth-values of all sentences of the form Fa are settled. Here open texture comes in: speakers can in some sense permissibly go either way with respect to the unsettled sentences. It is also here that the response-dependence comes in. It is by virtue of the judgments of competent speakers that utterances of borderline sentences have the truth-values they have. Finally, all of this yields a theory that respects the principle of tolerance. Suppose I go down a sorites series. I judge all items in the series before a to fall under F. Then I judge a not to fall under F. In every sorites series there will be a first case like this. The reason this is not, given Shapiro's view, a counterexample to the principle of tolerance (or to my competence) is that as I judge a not to be F, the context -- the "conversational score" to speak Lewisese, as Shapiro occasionally does -- shifts. The predicate F now has a different extension.

Now for some critical remarks.

Start with the principle of tolerance that Shapiro discusses. This principle is eminently plausible. I do not have any objection to the claim that it is true. My only concern is that I do not see how it is supposed to fit into the overall dialectic. It appears to be a principle that vagueness theorists of quite different kinds can agree on. So it is not clear what is the relation between it and Shapiro's other theses. That everyone agrees on the principle does not mean that everyone in fact can respect it. But Shapiro does not even attempt to mount a case for thinking that his contextualism is the only otherwise plausible view that can respect the principle.

Turn next to the claim of open texture. Here Shapiro's discussion is marred by his not sufficiently stressing the distinctions that must be drawn. (The distinctions can be gleaned from Shapiro's discussion; I am not saying he overlooks them -- my concern rather is that they don't get the attention they deserve.) Consider the following claims one can make about borderline sentences: (i) Borderline sentences are somehow 'unsettled' or 'open' -- whatever fixes the meanings of the expressions of our language hasn't fixed determinate truth-values for them. (ii) A borderline sentence can express something true in one context and something false in another. (iii) Speakers can permissibly genuinely disagree about the truth-values of the propositions expressed by borderline sentences, even in situations where they have all the relevant information. As Shapiro in effect recognizes (211), Waismann only clearly said something along the lines of (i). And although there is disagreement about (i), it has good claim to be the orthodox view. Shapiro wants to assert something at least as strong as (ii), and (i) does not entail (ii). (iii), finally, is Wright's view. It is stronger than (ii). A proponent of (ii) can explain instances of seemingly permissible disagreement by saying that the speakers in fact do not assert contradictory propositions. She would then avoid embracing the radical (iii), but at the seeming 'cost' of denying that the seeming disagreement really is genuine. Shapiro is not a proponent of (iii), contrary to what Shapiro's mention of Wright as an ally would suggest. For Shapiro, the relevant cases are not cases of genuine and permissible disagreement at all. When I say "Harry is bald" and you say "No, he's not bald", then either the context changes with our utterances in such a way that we both make true assertions, in which case we are not genuinely disagreeing at all (since the propositions we express can be jointly true), or, given the special character of the context, our assertive utterances fail to change the conversational score (207). A complication is Shapiro's distinction between external and internal context. Shapiro can hold that two speakers can be in the same external context and yet one can permissibly assertively utter a borderline sentence and the other its negation. This would be denied on less radical views. But still Shapiro's view is not as radical as that expressed by Wright.

Shapiro's formulations time and time again blur the use-mention distinction. Often this is no cause for concern. Blurring the use-mention distinction sometimes does not cause any confusion, and simply makes for greater readability. (I have myself blurred the distinction here, sometimes using 'F' to stand in for a predicate, sometimes using it to stand in for a name of a predicate. And I will keep on doing so.) But in the discussion of the open texture thesis, more care would have been desirable. Where Shapiro says that in some situations, "a speaker is free to assert Pa and free to assert ¬Pa", a better formulation, and one less likely to give rise to the impression that Shapiro's thesis is Wright's, would have been "a speaker is free to assertively utter 'Pa' and free to assertively utter '¬Pa'" (10). This would make clearer that Shapiro is not in fact a proponent of (iii).

Turn next to the contextualist thesis. I mentioned above that there is immediate cause for suspicion concerning the helpfulness of appeal to context. The contextualist has, I think everyone must agree, a relatively nice story to tell about what is going on in sorites paradoxes; perhaps especially of the forced march kind. The reason why we never find a sharp boundary between the Fs and the non-Fs is that it is never among the objects that are salient to us; whenever our focus shifts to a particular segment of a sorites series, the boundary, even should there be one, will not be there. But however nice this may be as a story, several puzzles about vagueness remain even given contextualism, and together they seem about as serious as what we started with. First, even if, with respect to long sorites series, it can seem plausible that we cannot judge the F-ness of each item within a single context, it is on the face of it ad hoc to deny that we can do this with short, intuitively surveyable sorites series (consider one for the predicate "natural number much smaller than 10"). Second, even if the speaker's focus will never be where a potential sharp boundary is, it seems that a semanticist concerned with a semantic theory for the speaker's language can significantly ask what is the extension of the speaker's predicate F in a given context C. And it will seem as implausible as ever that there should be a sharp boundary between what F applies to and what it doesn't. The contextualist might answer that there is no such sharp boundary: there will be a range of cases such that it is indeterminate whether F applies. But this just gives rise to familiar problems of higher-order vagueness. Where, in the sorites series, is the boundary between the objects such that F determinately applies to them and the indeterminate cases? And is this problem not exactly as serious as the original sharp boundaries problem, so we have made no progress?

Shapiro devotes a chapter to higher-order vagueness. But he seems not to sense the urgency of the problem: the problem of higher-order vagueness is not just another problem on the list which we can tick off when we get to it, but a sign that no real progress has been made. The solution to the problem of higher-order vagueness that Shapiro offers is to say that it is vague who counts as a competent user of a predicate F, and to say that this vagueness renders "borderline F" vague. Waive any worries about whether this is even relevant to higher-order vagueness. Focus instead on the question: how does this help with the problem we are concerned with? Taking the vagueness in who counts as a competent user of F into account, we get a richer division of cases than the tri-partite one we start out with. And the process can be repeated, for just as "competent user of F" is vague, so too "competent user of 'competent user of F'" is vague. But, to repeat a standard point from discussions of higher-order vagueness, no n-partite division of cases appears to be intuitively better than the original two-partite one.

Shapiro, although explicitly noting all of this, is surprisingly cavalier about the matter. He simply notes that as we ascend the hierarchy of ever more complicated questions about who is a competent user of F, the questions will quickly become harder to evaluate: "… the experiment will break down at the fourth or fifth level, if not before, for the simple reason that humans cannot parse questions that long… . A fortiori, we need not worry about transfinite levels" (143). Two worries about this. (a) Although the experiment would in practice break down, one might wonder whether a helping of the competence-performance distinction should dissuade us from concluding that there are no determinate answers at the fourth or fifth level. (b) Even if Shapiro is right in holding that the experiment will break down, and that this matters, one may wonder: how exactly does this help? The best suggested answer I can extract is that although the relevant counterfactuals will be indeterminate, this indeterminacy will be distinct from vagueness: and so it is not a problem for a theory of vagueness if it fails to account for indeterminacy (143; compare also 42).

Turn lastly to response-dependence. The discussion of vagueness in Raffman (1994), which Shapiro mentions as an important inspiration, focuses on how speakers actually react to borderline cases and to sorites series. Raffman and Shapiro fasten onto how a borderline case may be judged differently in different contexts by the same speaker. This provides a basic motivation for contextualism. But at least when only this much has been said about the motivation for the contextualist view, the view lies open to the following rejoinder: just because speakers judge borderline cases differently in different contexts doesn't mean that they can correctly do so. This problem is pressed against Raffman in Sorensen (2001), and Shapiro recognizes that the problem arises equally for his theory (41). That we judge different things to be F in different contexts clearly doesn't entail that F genuinely is context-sensitive. It is in response to this sort of objection that Raffman and Shapiro invoke response-dependence. Given response-dependence, one can relatively immediately argue from how speakers judge borderline cases to how borderline cases are correctly judged.

Neither Raffman nor Shapiro actually argues for response-dependence; it is simply postulated. (I suggested above that the scarcity of explicit arguments in Shapiro's book is due to the fact that he thinks the attractiveness of the resulting theory is argument enough.) Moreover, I think there are good reasons for doubt. There is an important distinction to be made. Compare:

(1) Speaker judgments help determine that 'F' is true of a.

(2) Speaker judgments help determine that a is F.

A claim of form (1) should appear initially plausible, no matter what predicate we consider. By contrast, some claims of form (2) should appear quite implausible. (Consider the predicate 'square'.) With these remarks in mind, let us return to borderline cases of vague predicates. Let Harry be a borderline case of a vague predicate 'bald', such that external features of the context do not settle the truth-value of "Harry is bald". Shapiro wants to hold that a subject can still truly judge "Harry is bald", and he wants to appeal to response-dependence here. But let C be a context of an assertive utterance of "Harry is bald". Then compare:

(3) Speaker judgments determine that 'bald' is true of Harry in C.

(4) [In C,] speaker judgments determine that Harry is bald.

For response-dependence to come into the picture at all, (4) must be true. But of these two claims, surely (3) is the only plausible one. Generally, (4) seems about as plausible--or, rather, implausible--regardless of whether Harry has borderline status or not. Speaker judgments determine the baldness of Harry just about as little as they determine the baldness of a determinately-bald Yul or a determinately-hairy Tom. But then appeal to response-dependence cannot serve to deflect Sorensen's worry. (A different concern regarding Shapiro's appeal to response-dependence is that it is not fully clear just what the claim of response-dependence is supposed to amount to. When Shapiro officially introduces it, the claim is explicitly only that borderline sentences not settled by external context are response-dependent (38ff). But elsewhere in the discussion (e.g. 143) Shapiro intimates that the view is that vagueness is due to response-dependence. That is a considerably stronger claim.)

The book is rich and rewarding. As should be clear from my earlier summary, there are several interesting themes I have not commented on in this review. Hopefully, the book will serve to stimulate important and vigorous discussion.


Graff, Delia: 2000, "Shifting Sands: An Interest-Relative Theory of Vagueness", Philosophical Topics 28: 45-81.

Kamp, Hans: 1981, "The Paradox of the Heap", in Uwe Mönnich (ed.), Aspects of Philosophical Logic, D. Reidel, Dordrecht, pp. 225-77.

Raffman, Diana: 1994, "Vagueness Without Paradox", Philosophical Review 103: 41-74.

Soames, Scott: 1999, Understanding Truth, Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Sorensen, Roy: 2001, Vagueness and Contradiction, Oxford University Press, Oxford.

Tappenden, Jamie: 1993, "The Liar and Sorites Paradoxes: Toward a Unified Treatment", Journal of Philosophy 90: 551-77.

Wright, Crispin: 1992, Truth and Objectivity, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.

Wright, Crispin: 2003, Saving the Differences, Harvard University Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.