Value-Free Science? Ideals and Illusions

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Harold Kincaid, John Dupré, and Alison Wylie (eds.), Value-Free Science? Ideals and Illusions, Oxford University Press, 2007, 241pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195308969.

Reviewed by Lisa Gannett, St. Mary's University, Halifax


This timely volume edited by Harold Kincaid, John Dupré, and Alison Wylie has its origins in a conference of the same name organized by Kincaid at the University of Alabama at Birmingham in 2002. All contributors to Value-Free Science? Ideals and Illusions are philosophers, across a range of career levels. Chapters are organized into three parts: "Case Studies," "Evidence and Values," and "Values and General Philosophy of Science Perspectives." A well structured and informative introduction provides readers with background on the question of values in science: reasons why the question matters, a historical overview of philosophical conceptions of relations between facts and values, a conceptual analysis of the claim that science is value-laden, and a synopsis of the ensuing chapters. In view of the fabulous job the editors do introducing the book, I have tried to be brief in my description of its contents, so to leave space to explore some points of disagreement among the authors that serve to illuminate ongoing debates.

The case studies in Part I are varied: they are drawn from biology, psychology, sociology, and economics.

In "Fact and Value" (Chapter One), John Dupré illustrates limits of the fact-value distinction with examples of ways in which values are implicated in the reporting of scientific findings. Numerical data may appear value-neutral, but this is often misleading: when economists measure inflation by using the same scale for changes in prices of luxury goods and basic necessities, they ignore the differential impact of these. Some concepts are irreducibly normative: when evolutionary psychologists offer an adaptationist explanation of rape, their studies of even flies or ducks do not escape the meanings that attach to rape in human society. Scientific research also directs social interventions: when so-called welfare economists disregard justice by reducing Pareto optimality to efficiency, "the ability to produce more stuff with the same resources" becomes the default goal of economic policy (p. 36).

In "Social Problems" (Chapter Two), Michael Root examines efforts by Merton and Blumer to make sociology an objective, value-free science which coincided with the founding of the Society for the Study of Social Problems and the journal Social Problems in the 1950s. Merton's approach defined practices as social problems in relationship to society's functional norms: the sociologist describes how improving educational opportunities for members of lower castes will affect the caste system without taking a normative stance on the caste system itself. Blumer's approach required that there be public disapproval of practices like alcoholism or homosexuality for these to count as social problems, but sociologists were not charged with assessing whether the disapproval was legitimate or not. Root argues that this failure to engage normative questions compromised the ability of both approaches to inform social policy.

In "Coming to Terms with the Values of Science: Insights from Feminist Science Studies Scholarship" (Chapter Three), Alison Wylie and Lynn Hankinson Nelson remind us how pivotal the work of feminist scientists and philosophers of science has been in post-Kuhnian debates about science and values, especially in maintaining a "third option" between objectivism and relativism that recognizes that values can exert positive as well as negative effects on scientific research. Archeology provides an example of how nonepistemic values can promote epistemic aims: as more women entered the field, questions previously unasked were asked, and assumptions previously unchallenged were challenged -- for example, attending more closely to women's activities disproved the assumption that these were archeologically inaccessible because associated with perishable materials like baskets. Embryology provides an example of how nonepistemic values influence the weighting of epistemic values: in the standard account of sex differentiation offered in the early 1980s, androcentrism and metaphors of male activity and female passivity favored simplicity over empirical adequacy and explanatory scope, with the female pathway treated as the default route taken in the absence of the Y-chromosome and "male" hormones.

Despite the interest of postpositivist philosophers in scientific practice, little attention has been paid to peer review and citation practices. K. Brad Wray seeks to remedy this in "Evaluating Scientists: Examining the Effects of Sexism and Nepotism" (Chapter Four). On the basis of empirical studies, Wray concludes that the "explicit" judgments of competence scientists make about their peers in hiring and funding decisions are influenced by gender and nepotism to the detriment of the community's epistemic goals, but that gender does not influence the "implicit" judgments of competence scientists make about their peers when they decide to cite them in their own research. Wray hypothesizes that this is because the narrower range of choices available for appropriate citations leaves less opportunity for nonepistemic values to enter.

Part II consists of just two chapters. Elliott Sober's "Evidence and Value Freedom" (Chapter Five) and Heather Douglas' "Rejecting the Ideal of Value-Free Science" (Chapter Six) take opposing positions on the role of values in scientific reasoning.

Sober contends that an outright dismissal of the ideal of value-free science risks throwing out the baby with the bathwater. Sober argues that value-free science is properly defended by the assertion that the truth of a proposition can be determined independently of knowledge of the ethical and political consequences of belief in the proposition, and not, as the ideal's defenders frequently assume, by rejection of the view that the ethical and political consequences of belief in a proposition provide evidence for its truth. This holds in some cases, as does its entailed symmetrical claim: even if James is right that believing in God improves people's lives, these ethical consequences do not provide evidence that God exists; conversely, the theist's well-being depends only on her belief in God and not God's actual existence. But there are counter-examples: when a physician believes a drug is safe and prescribes it to her patients, their well-being depends on the drug's actual safety -- hence, the ethical consequences of the physician's decision are evidential. Nevertheless, an asymmetry between facts and values persists: the drug's safety can be discovered by scientific investigation alone, whereas the ethical judgment cannot be made without this knowledge.

Douglas reaches the opposite conclusion -- that nonepistemic values are logically necessary for scientific reasoning. Douglas emphasizes that scientists make many choices in the course of their research: what methods to use, how to delineate data, how to interpret findings. In policy-directed scientific research, where uncertainties exist and errors come with consequences, these choices will be influenced by the interplay of epistemic and nonepistemic values in weighing potential risks. Douglas' argument suggests that Sober is mistaken about scientists' abilities to assess the probability of a drug's safety independently of ethical or political considerations: presumably, whatever result is ultimately obtained depends on how researchers balanced risks.

Part III brings us to broader epistemological questions concerning the role of values in science. These chapters engage with the trajectory of 20th-century philosophy of science: the "received view" attributed to logical positivists and logical empiricists, "post-positivist" challenges to the received view, and the divergent approaches of the past several decades -- realist, constructive empiricist, feminist, naturalized, postmodern, etc.

In "Is Logical Empiricism Committed to the Ideal of Value-Free Science?" (Chapter Seven), John T. Roberts challenges the prevalent assumption that logical empiricism is so committed. Roberts' approach is more logical than historical: he is interested in whether the approach to philosophy of science we call "logical empiricism" is committed to the ideal of value-free science, and not whether the philosophers we call "logical empiricists" were. Roberts argues that the logical empiricist approach to confirmation finds no justification in the ideal of value-free science because there is inadequate knowledge to support the empirical claim that it promotes epistemic values like truth or empirical adequacy. However, the approach's reliance on formal relations between hypothesis and observation statements, thereby placing no restrictions on content, finds justification in its embodiment of a nonepistemic value: egalitarianism in cultural traditions and world views.[1]

Helen Longino's work, especially her 1990 Science as Social Knowledge, provides a foil -- often too conveniently -- for the last three chapters of Value-Free Science?.

In "Constructive Empiricism and the Role of Social Values in Science" (Chapter Eight), Sherrilyn Roush agrees with Longino that there is a legitimate role for social values in theory choice. However, Roush is sympathetic to Haack's criticism of Longino -- specifically, that preferring that the world be a certain way provides no reasons for believing it to be so. Roush argues that Longino's realist commitments leave her vulnerable to Haack's attack, and that a better alternative is to adopt van Fraassen's constructive empiricism. For constructive empiricists, it is permissible to choose among empirically adequate rival theories for pragmatic reasons, including social values. Because acceptance of a theory requires commitment only to its empirical adequacy and not its truth, Haack's criticism is averted: preferring that the world be a certain way provides a reason to choose one empirically adequate theory over another but not to believe the world really is that way.

In "The Value Ladenness of Scientific Knowledge" (Chapter Nine), Gerald Doppelt agrees with Longino that scientific knowledge is value-laden, but rejects her appeal to the underdetermination of theory by evidence to make the case. This is because underdetermination implies conclusions other than value-ladenness -- for example, the realist's defense of inference to the best explanation or the naturalist's defense of reliabilism. Inspired by Kuhn, Doppelt appeals instead to the history of science. He argues that scientific knowledge is value-laden because it is always justified relative to the epistemic standards of particular scientific communities as well as the facts. Epistemic standards, often embedded in wider social and practical interests, determine what count as interesting phenomena, acceptable theories, and valid inferences. Doppelt outlines his goal of developing a "critical theory of scientific argumentation" that contributes to the rational resolution of "politically charged epistemological conflict" by recognizing that controversies which appear to be about facts may instead be about epistemic standards or wider social and practical interests (p. 195).

In "Contextualist Morals and Science" (Chapter Ten), Kincaid's defense of contextualism, defined as the view that "all evaluation is local and empirical" (p. 220), leads him to criticize epistemological assumptions made on both sides of the debate about values in science. On the value-ladenness side, Kincaid dismisses Longino's argument based on underdetermination: "Comparing 'all the data' with 'all the possible hypotheses' is an incoherent situation we are never in" (p. 222). Kincaid recognizes that local underdetermination occurs, but argues that this calls for further scientific investigation, not the use of moral or political values to settle the matter. On the value freedom side, Kincaid rejects arguments based on Humean-inspired moral skepticism: for contextualists, "entire domains of discourse" cannot be evaluated "in a single swoop on conceptual grounds" (p. 224). Kincaid concludes that a misguided question underlies the debate: there is no more an a priori basis for delineating a place for values in science than there is for excluding values from science.

Some of these criticisms of Longino seem misplaced to me. Longino is not guilty of Haack's crudely fashioned charge, nor is she the realist Roush portrays her to be. Longino (2002) develops an epistemology independent of particular metaphysical commitments, and in doing so, rejects monistic realism, the view that "for any natural process there is one and only one correct account of it" (p. 44). So she is not committed to any preferred theory's truth, as Roush claims. Longino treats realism and constructive empiricism as capturing different aims scientists themselves may have, with some committed to truth and others to empirical adequacy. Kincaid misinterprets Longino's negative claims as positive ones. Once we accept with Duhem that logic alone cannot decide between theories, the question becomes whether there is a formal basis for allowing epistemic values and disallowing nonepistemic values, and the answer is that there is not. But this negative pattern of argumentation does not imply anything about scientific practice. Longino does not suggest -- in the spirit of the curve-fitting problem mentioned by Kincaid -- that there are always qualified contenders with equivalent empirical support; nor does she claim that nonepistemic values are always implicated; nor does she advocate settling scientific debates on ethical or political grounds and foregoing further investigation. For Longino, such questions need to be addressed on a case-by-case basis, presumably in a way more sympathetic to Kincaid's contextualism than he recognizes.

Although Anglo-American philosophers of science have traditionally defended the value-neutrality of science by characterizing value-laden science as "bad" science, times appear to have changed. Wylie and Nelson open their essay: "It was clear that a sea change was under way in philosophical thinking about values in science when Robert Nozick delivered his presidential address to the American Philosophical Association in 1997" (p. 58). Nozick expressed support for a third way of thinking about values in science, which rejects both objectivists' defense of the value-neutrality of science and relativists' attack on science as politics by other means, for the recognition that nonepistemic values may contribute to, not detract from, scientific objectivity. With sea changes, doubt often arises whether anyone ever actually held the position that has come into question, and along these lines, Sober expresses skepticism that any philosopher ever believed the "absurdity" that scientists are not influenced by ethical and political values when they do science: "scientists are people, just like the rest of us" (p. 109). However, Sober proceeds immediately to characterize any such questions about values in science as psychological and sociological -- not philosophical -- in nature. Still looming over us is a theoretical framework relegating values to places like problem choice, the context of discovery, and application so not to impugn the rationality and objectivity of scientific knowledge philosophers have long staked as their claim. The contributors to Value-Free Science? -- especially in their points of disagreement -- help to locate ongoing debates vis-à-vis this framework.

Most of the volume's contributors make use of the distinction between epistemic and nonepistemic values to address the question of values in science. Once epistemic (or cognitive) values like truth, empirical adequacy, explanatory scope, simplicity, etc. are considered, clearly, as Roberts writes, "[a] completely value-free science is an illusion" (p. 143). What is contentious is the role of nonepistemic (or contextual) values -- social, ethical, political, etc. Only Wray makes an effort to define the distinction: appealing to McMullin (1984), he counts values as epistemic if they are perceived by scientists to be contributing to understanding the world (p. 88). But this definition seems inadequate even for Wray's own purposes. Wray admits that gender and class were epistemic values for Boyle and other members of the Royal Society who placed greatest trust in the testimony of gentlemen witnesses; similarly, if we are to rely on scientists' own perceptions for drawing the distinction, might not the nepotism Wray counts as a nonepistemic value reflect a hiring committee member's perception that a young scientist trained at his alma mater or in a collaborator's lab is the best or safest bet when it comes to experimental technique or some other capability relevant to understanding the world?

More important than a definition -- after all, enumeration works quite well in the case of epistemic and nonepistemic values -- is clarifying the role of these different sorts of values, especially their interplay, in scientific practice. Roush argues that "epistemic resources" should always be "exhausted" in theory choice: only once it has been established that there is more than one empirically adequate theory are social values and other pragmatic factors allowed to contribute (p. 171). Doppelt similarly privileges epistemic over nonepistemic values: on his account of the value-ladenness of scientific knowledge, "the value commitments or interests at stake are, in the final analysis, cognitive or epistemic values" (p. 190). This reflects Doppelt's focus as a philosopher on whether an epistemic standard is justified by reasons rather than on the social or practical interests responsible for bringing the standard about, but it may compromise his aim of helping to resolve scientific controversies rooted in conflicting social or political priorities. In any case, both Doppelt's and Roush's accounts require a defensible distinction between epistemic and nonepistemic values that works in practice as well as in theory, but as several other contributors point out, this prospect is challenged by Rooney (1992) and Longino (1995, 1997).

The fact-value distinction is invoked in different ways by different authors, and not surprisingly, these differences shed light on their various accounts. Douglas maintains that facts and values are logically distinct and agrees with Hume's proscription against deriving an ought from an is. Her account's restricted role for values in science, whereby the formulation of factual claims is influenced by the weighing of risks, reflects this: since facts are propositions that are simply true or false, only in the presence of uncertainty and possible error is room left for values to exert their effects. Dupré admits there are paradigm cases of factual and evaluative statements, but argues that much of our scientific language contains terms that are both factual and evaluative -- especially concerning things that interest us. This is readily apparent in the irreducible normativity of the concept of rape -- as Dupré writes, with characteristic wryness: "Those who supposed they were investigating the causes of rape but, since they were good scientists, were doing so with no preconceptions as to whether it was a good or a bad thing, are deeply confused: They lack any grasp of what it is that they are purporting to investigate" (p. 34). But what about areas of science remote from public policy (as discussed by Douglas) or what interests us (as discussed by Dupré)? Both authors accept modified versions of the distinction between basic and applied science. Douglas admits that nonepistemic values may be absent from research carried out "for pure curiosity" rather than "for use" (p. 122); however, citing the example of nuclear physics, she warns that the line between basic and applied science is not stable over time: "Once thought to be a completely esoteric and useless area of research, it quite rapidly (between December 1938 and February 1939) came to be recognized as an area of research with immense potential practical implications" (p. 138). Dupré allows that results in physics (or chemistry or mathematics) may be value-free because they address questions of "no immediate importance to us" except cognitively; to argue otherwise, he says, "seems most plausibly to depend on some such claim as that physics really is, contrary to appearances or propaganda, the science of bomb building" (p. 32).

The connections Douglas and Dupré draw between nuclear physics and bomb building are interesting to contemplate. The ideal of value-free science has its own history (see Proctor 1991), and the distinction between basic and applied science is very much a product of WWII. The bang the U.S. government received for its war-time buck yielded not only appreciation of the utility of science and willingness to pay, but a basic-applied distinction that served to protect scientific research from government interference while at the same time securing public funds. The basic-applied distinction also served to insulate scientists from calls for social responsibility in the aftermath of Hiroshima and Nagasaki. But nuclear physics was not thought "completely esoteric and useless" until December 1938, as Douglas claims. From the beginning, scientists and science fiction writers mused about various consequences of harnessing atomic energy, ranging from the mundane ("Are our bicycles to be lighted with disks of radium in tiny lanterns," asked chemist H. C. Bolton in 1900) to the terrifying (the powerful atomic bombs described in H. G. Wells' 1914 The World Set Free) (Badash 1998). And given the practical context provided by experimental manipulability, nuclear physics need not be reduced to bomb building for its claims to have evaluative as well as descriptive content, as Dupré supposes: decisions about how to intervene in the laboratory direct, and are directed by, possible interventions in the world.

Anyone who is interested in the question of values in science (how to reconceive objectivity, the distinction between epistemic and nonepistemic values, the value-ladenness of scientific claims, the basic-applied science distinction, etc.) will find Value-Free Science? a worthwhile read. Nonphilosophers of science will be intrigued by the range of issues and diversity of approaches covered, and philosophers of science will appreciate the points of disagreement persisting among even those who are part of the sea change mentioned by Wylie and Nelson. Value-Free Science? would be a suitable text for an upper-year undergraduate or graduate seminar on science and values, and several of the essays would be useful additions to an upper-year undergraduate or graduate philosophy of science syllabus. Dupré's essay is engaging and accessible and serves as an excellent introduction to the topic of science and values; Wylie and Nelson's essay is notable for its analysis of the interaction of epistemic and nonepistemic values and detailed overview of contributions made by feminist scientists and philosophers of science; Douglas' essay is informative about science and public policy, which is an area often ignored by philosophers of science, and offers a lucid discussion of various senses of objectivity. Although the essays in Value-Free Science? are concerned mostly with the question of values in science, the question of how science might best serve society also arises. The logical empiricist ideal of value freedom, as characterized by Roberts, holds that the nonepistemic values of applied science are best served indirectly by a science committed only to epistemic goals. Root argues instead that sociologists need to debate values if they want their research to be relevant to public policy, while Doppelt's admirable effort to bring the analytical tools of philosophers of science to bear on politically charged epistemological conflict follows from the recognition that scientists' epistemic goals may be embedded in wider social and practical interests. As philosophers of science, we often forget that the ideal of value-free science sought not just to protect the autonomy and integrity of science but to secure society's authority over value questions. Sea change or no sea change, much room for theorizing and debate remains.


Badash, L. 1998. Scientists and the Development of Nuclear Weapons: From Fission to the Limited Test Ban Treaty, 1939-1963. New York: Humanity Books.

Longino, H. E. 1990. Science as Social Knowledge: Values and Objectivity in Scientific Inquiry. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

Longino, H. E. 1995. "Gender, Politics, and the Theoretical Virtues." Synthese 104: 383-97.

Longino, H. E. 1997. "Cognitive and Non-Cognitive Values in Science: Rethinking the Dichotomy." In M. C. Nelson and S. M. Nelson, eds., Feminism, Science, and the Philosophy of Science, 39-58. Dordrecht: Kluwer Academic.

Longino, H. E. 2002. The Fate of Knowledge. Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.

McMullin, E. 1984. "The Rational and the Social in the History of Science." In J. R. Brown, ed., Scientific Rationality: The Sociological Turn, 127-63. Dordrecht: D. Reidel.

Okruhlik, K. 2005. "Logical Empiricism, Feminism, and Neurath's Auxiliary Motive." Hypatia 19: 48-72.

Proctor, R. N. 1991. Value-Free Science? Purity and Power in Modern Knowledge. Cambridge, MA and London: Harvard University Press.

Rooney, P. 1992. "On Values in Science: Is the Epistemic/Non-epistemic Distinction Useful?" PSA 1992, vol. 1: 13-22.

Uebel, T. E. 2000. "Logical Empiricism and the Sociology of Knowledge: The Case of Neurath and Frank." Philosophy of Science 67 (Proceedings): S138-S150.

[1] There is some irony in Roberts' conclusion that logical empiricism's approach to confirmation simply embodies egalitarianism but cannot be said to promote egalitarianism as a social or political value (as for epistemic values, this would be an empirical claim lacking in justification). Actual logical empiricists like Frank and Neurath did conceive a role for social and political values even in the context of justification (Uebel 2000; Okruhlik 2005).