Value Matters: Studies in Axiology

Placeholder book cover

Nicholas Rescher, Value Matters: Studies in Axiology, Ontos Verlag, 2004, 134pp, Euro 58,00 (hbk), ISBN 3937202676.

Reviewed by Rob Lawlor, University of Reading


Value Matters is (predominantly at least) a discussion of moral and epistemological principles, and the relationship (the similarities and the differences) between the two. In relation to both, Rescher defends pragmatism. In many ways though, Value Matters reads more like a collection of essays rather than a monograph. Although I have suggested that there is, essentially, a single theme to the book, it is not always clear how some chapters fit into the greater whole. Certainly, reading the book for the first time, I was rather unnerved by the shift from moral philosophy to epistemology and the philosophy of science. To some extent, I have a better idea of what the book was trying to do now that I have finished it, and the last chapter ties some of the ends together, but the book definitely would have benefited from an introductory chapter explaining its aims and purposes.

Rescher compares moral reasoning with other forms of reasoning in chapters 4 and 7. In chapter 4, he argues that it is a mistake to think that there is a very big difference between reasoning regarding values and reasoning regarding facts, and in this chapter he also deals with the is-ought gap. Regarding the latter, Rescher concedes that, although there is a gap between facts and values, it is "often such a small gap that it can be crossed by a step so short as to be effectively trivial, namely by means of truisms." (p. 52)

For example, consider the following argument:

Doing A would cause Smith needless and pointless distress

Therefore: it would be wrong for me, or anyone, to do A. (p.52)

Rescher claims that, as it stands, this argument is invalid: "where only ostensibly value-free facts go in, values cannot come out." (p. 51.) However, in order to make this argument valid, we need only add the following premise: "It is wrong to do something that avoidably causes people needless and pointless pain" (p. 52) and this premise, Rescher argues, is unproblematically available.

Returning to the comparison between reasoning about values and reasoning about facts, Rescher argues that, in both cases, reasoning is the "systematization of experience". And, in both cases, "the same standard applies throughout: a judgement is valid if it belongs to the optimal, most cogent systematization of the whole range of our relevant, aletheically fact-orientated experience on the one side and that of our relevant, axiologically value orientated experience on the other." (p. 55.)

As such, Rescher claims that it is not surprising that we should find that we have analogous problems on both sides. In epistemology, there is concern about the gap between appearance and reality, and in moral philosophy there is concern about the gap between subjective evaluative feelings and objectively correct actual evaluation. Just as we want to be able to move from the observation that there seems to be a cat on the mat to the claim that there is a cat on the mat, we want to move from the claim that it seems wicked to kick the cat to the claim that it actually is wicked to kick the cat. Rescher's insight then is to insist that if the coherence account can bridge the gap in the case of epistemology it must be able to do so in the case of value judgements too. Rescher claims that, "Our knowledge of both sorts of facts … hinges on the criteriological bearing of the question: What merits approbation?" (p. 54.)

Rescher returns to the topic of approbation in chapter 7, in which he compares moral credit with epistemic credit. He claims that moral credit is quite different from epistemic credit. In the case of epistemic credit, Rescher argues that only the result matters -- it is "product driven". Moral credit, on the other hand, is much less concerned with results, and is primarily concerned with intention or what people do. Rescher then offers a pragmatic justification for this difference, appealing to the purpose of giving credit.

Rescher argues that the purpose of morality is to safeguard people's interests. Actual results, however, are often out of the agent's control, and so "getting people to try to do the proper thing will generally optimise the chances of success." (p. 93.) The purpose of inquiry, on the other hand, is the achievement of knowledge. Therefore, enquiry is product driven, and thus "intent is irrelevant and achievement determinative." (p. 93.)

Finally, at the end of this chapter, Rescher stresses the pragmatic nature of his account, writing: "the cardinal rule of pragmatic rationality is the same throughout: 'Proceed in a manner that is optimally efficient and effective in realizing the purposes at hand.'" (p. 95.)

There are, however, a number of problems with this line of argument, which Rescher does not address. Regarding Rescher's pragmatism, there are some areas in which a pragmatic account is not appropriate. Rescher concedes that this is the case with truth (see below), but surely it must also be true of desert. I suggest that the following must be true: someone deserves credit for doing x only if they did x. Furthermore, the truth of this should not depend on whether or not giving credit in this way is optimally efficient and effective.

Even if we accept Rescher's framework, there are problems with the details of Rescher's pragmatic approach. First, Rescher does not provide a convincing argument to explain why the account that applies to moral credit shouldn't also apply to epistemic credit (or vice versa).

Remember, in relation to moral credit, the way to optimise success is to get people to try to do what is right. But why should we think that this won't be true in the case of epistemic credit too? After all, a principle that says that we should give credit to researchers who work hard, and who follow the guidelines of good practice, will produce diligent and conscientious researchers just as the parallel principle will produce morally conscientious citizens. Rescher assumes that this will optimise success in the moral case, but he does not explain why this wouldn't be the case in the case of epistemic credit. It's not that his arguments are unconvincing. Rather, Rescher simply doesn't address this question in any detail. Furthermore, in chapter 8, he does talk about the virtues that we should want our researchers to possess if science is to flourish. As such, this seems to be in conflict with the claims of chapter 7.

Furthermore, it is not clear that we do give credit in the way that Rescher suggests. Many have argued, in relation to moral credit, that the results do make a difference to our evaluation -- but Rescher does not address the issue of moral luck. And regarding epistemic credit, it is not clear that we do care only about the result. Imagine there is a debate regarding the truth of x. I say that x is true, but only on the basis of the toss of a coin. If x was indeed true, and if we care only about the result, I would deserve epistemic credit for making the right choice, despite the fact that my "procedure" was far from ideal. If the research leader discovered that this is how I conduct my research, surely he would sack me, rather than commend me, regardless of the result. Furthermore, this is what he ought to do.

Rescher's pragmatism is evident (in the background at least), throughout most of the book. For many, pragmatism is at its most implausible when it tries to give a pragmatic account of truth, such that a belief is true if (to put it crudely) it "works."

In chapter 5, Rescher offers a much more plausible form of pragmatism. Here, he acknowledges the concern that if we take a "hard objectivistic line" on the meaning of truth it looks like truth will become inaccessible. As such, pragmatists such as William James wanted to "soften" the meaning of truth in order to avoid scepticism. Rescher, however, insists that there is another alternative: we adapt a theory of "criteriology." This means that we don't try to validate our truth claims by defining "truth" in terms of success. Instead, we validate our methods by appealing to their success, and then we use our inquiry methods to validate the truth claims. Rescher calls this methodological pragmatism, and contrasts this with thesis pragmatism.

If this chapter presents pragmatism in its most plausible and "down to earth" form, Rescher goes to the opposite end of the scale in chapter 8, where he defends a far more radical claim.

Rescher begins this chapter by considering the possibility that reality could be such that we could not understand it or explain it: "nature must operate in such a way as to be 'user friendly' to intelligent enquiring beings if they are to be able to penetrate at least some of its salient features." (p. 98.) Thus, the question is, is reality user friendly? We expect scientific theories to be orderly and lawful, and it is a virtue if they are simple. But why should we believe that reality itself is orderly, lawful and (relatively speaking) simple? Ultimately, Rescher's solution to this problem is to appeal to "a Law of Optimality", which states that "whatever possibility is for the best is ipso facto the possibility that is actualized." (p. 105.)

Of course, the big question now is, why should we assume that there is a law of optimality? Rescher has two arguments. The first is that "value represents a decisive advantage in regard to realization in that in the virtual competition for existence among alternatives it is the comparatively best that is bound to prevail." (p. 103.) But this argument is guilty of what Rescher calls respect-neglect, which he discusses in chapter 6. Rescher is guilty of respect-neglect here because he fails to say in what respect an alternative is best. And, of course, the alternative that is best in respect of survival (such that it is plausible to claim that the best is bound to prevail) may not be the best in respect of "user friendliness". It should be conceded, however, that this is not Rescher's main argument. The main argument comes later. Rescher imagines the reader asking, "But why should it be that optimalism obtains?" (p. 105.) It is not a conceptual or necessary truth, and as such must be a contingent truth. Therefore, optimalism itself must require explanation. Rescher concedes this, but insists that we should not rule out self-explanation. Indeed, given that we want to avoid an infinite regress, it would be a virtue if the "final" theory is self-explanatory. So, why should it be the case that best possibility is actualised? Simply because this is for the best.

There are (at least) two major objections to Rescher's arguments, the second of which comes out of the reply to the first. And the first is the obvious one: surely we can see, just by looking around us, that this is false. The best possible world does not exist. We can think of many ways in which the world could be better than it is.

Rescher has two responses to this. The first is to argue that absolute perfection is simply impossible, and to claim that "optimalism does not maintain that the world is absolutely perfect but just that it be the best that is possible -- that it outranks the available alternatives." (p. 113.) The second is to claim that what is best is not necessarily what is best from the point of view of our interests. Thus, Rescher argues that, in a sense, his thesis is a pessimistic one. Far from being wishful thinking, "it holds that even the best of possible arrangements is bound to exhibit very real imperfections from the angle of narrowly parochial concerns or interests." (p. 114.)

These arguments cannot help Rescher though. Regarding the first response, one can accept that absolute perfection is impossible but yet remain unconvinced by the claim that this world is the best of all possible worlds. At this point, Rescher will appeal to his second claim, and insist that we should not consider what is best from our parochial point of view. The issue, he claims, "is going to pivot on the question of what 'inherently best' means. If it means 'best' from the angle of your desires, or of my interests, or even of the advantage of homo-sapiens in general, then clearly the thesis loses its strong appeal. For such plausibility that 'best' had best be construed as looking to the condition of existence-as-a-whole rather than one particular privileged individual or group." (p. 113.)

Here though, it seems that Rescher has forgotten the problem that he was trying to solve in the first place. His worry was that reality may not be user friendly, and his solution was to claim that reality is "user friendly" because "whatever possibility is for the best is ipso facto the possibility that is actualized." But, in saying this, he must be considering what is best parochially, in respect of user-friendliness. Thus, if, in his analysis, he insists that optimalism isn't concerned with what is best in this parochial sense, Rescher's argument falls apart. There is no reason to suppose that optimalism, even if it were true, would guarantee that reality is user friendly. Again, Rescher is guilty of what he himself calls respect-neglect. There is no reason to suppose that the possibility that is best in respect of existence-as-a-whole will also be the possibility that is best in respect of (human) user-friendliness.

In this review I have only discussed a few of the nine chapters, but I have tried to concentrate on those chapters which seemed to contribute most to a coherent whole. As such, I hope to have given some indication of the flavour of the book as a whole, rather than only the specific chapters discussed. In general, Value Matters is full of interesting proposals but, in many cases, more argument is required. Consequently, I cannot recommend this book unreservedly. However, for those interested in the issues that Rescher addresses, there is definitely food for thought.