Value, Reality and Desire

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Graham Oddie, Value, Reality and Desire, Oxford University Press, 2005, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199273413.

Reviewed by Timothy Chappell, The Open University


"Values can affect us, causally, and it is through their causal impact on us that we can have knowledge of value" (2); "experiences of value are necessary, though not sufficient, for us to have knowledge of value" (24); "desires are experiences of value" (24). This triad of striking claims constitutes the heart of Graham Oddie's argument in this remarkable, entertaining, and original study in metaethics. His moral metaphysics is a "robust" moral realism. His moral epistemology anchors this realism, not in some weird species of intuition, but in a familiar and homely part of our experience: our desires (42). My desiring something is its seeming good to me (46); my correctly seeing it as good is my knowing that it is good; when I see something as good, it acts on me -- I undergo a form of causal impact.

Oddie's most distinctive proposal, and my main focus here, is his thesis that desires are experiences of value. This "experience conjecture" immediately prompts a number of difficult questions. First, his assimilation of desire and moral cognition can be challenged, in both directions: it seems possible to believe (or even know) that something is good without desiring it in the slightest, and to desire something without in the slightest believing that it is good. Secondly, people's desires obviously differ, and in many cases even conflict; and it is a familiar thought about desires that they are not rationally criticisable as beliefs are. When I want p and you want not-p, must it be that either of us is wrong? Thirdly, if goodness is a property which we can experience -- can be causally affected by -- then some kind of account of this is needed; we need to understand the metaphysics of the property of goodness.

Oddie's book gives ingenious, detailed, and sometimes quite technical answers to these questions, all of which repay more careful study than I can give them here. His answer to the first question, about the relation of desire and moral cognition, comes out in Chapter 2. Here he considers what he takes to be a puzzling asymmetry: the asymmetry between the two utterances "x is good, but he has no desire for x" and "x is good, but I have no desire for x" (29). Judgement internalism nicely explains why this asymmetry is puzzling: because my affirming that x is good implies something about my own desires -- namely that I have at least some measure of desire for x -- but nothing about anyone else's. But judgement internalism is not an attractive position for a moral realist, leading as it does too easily to the reduction of moral beliefs to affective attitudes, and so to an expressivist conception of moral content.

Oddie considers the suggestion that he calls "the merit connection" -- the proposal, in effect, that my uttering "x is good" does not imply "I desire x" but rather "I have reason to desire x" (38-9). The merit connection brings out the puzzling asymmetry too. It is puzzling to affirm something that I know implies that I have a desire that I know I don't have. It is also puzzling to affirm something that I know implies that I have a reason that I know I don't acknowledge. Both are puzzling in ways that their third-person correlates are not puzzling. However, Oddie prefers a different explanation of why the puzzle is a puzzle. His explanation is that beliefs like "x is good" are characteristically justified by being based on experiences of x as good. (Compare perceptual beliefs, such as "the rose is red", which are characteristically justified by being based on experiences of roses as red.) Now experience of x as good, according to Oddie, is desire for x (46). So while the belief that x is good is not the same thing as the experience of x as good, and while the experience is intrinsically motivating (because it is a desire) whereas the belief is not intrinsically motivating, there still is an oddity about "x is good, but I have no desire for x" which is not there in "x is good, but he has no desire for x". The oddity is that my affirmation "x is good" is characteristically based upon my experience of x as good, i.e. my desire for x. So it is puzzling (though not inexplicable) if I affirm "x is good" yet do not desire x. Since, by contrast, there is no such connection between my affirming "x is good" and anyone else's desires, there is no parallel puzzle about "x is good, but he has no desire for x".

Compare here the case of the rose. There is perhaps a marginal asymmetry between "The rose is red but it does not seem red to him" and "The rose is red but it does not seem red to me". The latter is slightly odder than the former. But neither is very odd, and there is not much of a puzzle either about how these statements might make sense, or about why it takes slightly more to make sense of the first-personal statement. The key word is "characteristic". Odd -- uncharacteristic -- lighting conditions can obviously prevent someone else from seeing the rose in its true colours. A modicum of scientific maturity will show me that they can prevent me too from seeing it right, in exactly the same fashion. While I normally learn about the colour of roses from their seeming-colours in my experience, I can readily "get past" my colour-experience in reflection, and tell when it is likely to be unreliable. We can suggest that exactly parallel remarks hold about value experience. My affirmation that "x is good" is characteristically based upon my experience of x as good. But in uncharacteristic cases there will be plenty of other ways of basing it (testimony, for instance), and then it will be completely unpuzzling that my belief that x is good should be accompanied by no desire for x.

This is Oddie confronting the first question for his theory that I raised in my second paragraph above -- the question why we should not have a complete divorce between desires and beliefs about goodness. His answer is that there can indeed be a divorce between desires and beliefs about goodness, but not between desires and experiences of goodness. The perceptual analogy is central to his thinking here, as should be clear from my comparison of what the goodness of x comes to in experience, according to Oddie, with perception of the redness of a rose.

The perceptual analogy is also central to what Oddie says about the second question I raised above, about disagreements in value-perception. Oddie explains these disagreements partly by way of the simple and familiar realist point that desires are no more infallible than perceptions, and partly by an appeal to perspective (63):

If desires are experiences of value, and experiences of value not only can but should be perspectival, then this goes a long way to explaining away what is otherwise a deep and intractable problem for realism about value. We can embrace a world of agent-neutral value without condemning as defective or perverse the persistently agent-relative nature of desire. But also, the perspectival nature of value experiences no more undermines their claim to yield a glimpse of value, than the perspectival nature of ordinary perception undermines its claim to yield data about the material world.

This is a rich and promising suggestion for a way of spelling out the perceptual direction in moral epistemology, and helps to show how easy it is for irrealists such as expressivists to underestimate the resources of a perceptual model.

But let me backtrack here, because there is more to say about Oddie on the first problem. His position (we saw above) is precisified as the view that there can indeed be a logical divorce between desires and beliefs about goodness, but not between desires and experiences of goodness. We might still find this latter, more precise claim problematic. Can't we experience x as good yet not desire x, and desire x yet not experience it as good?

Perhaps Oddie would reply "That isn't an objection to my theory; it is my theory". But he needs to say more than this, for plausible apparent counter-examples of both kinds can be found. A case where someone experiences x as good yet does not desire x is surely Iago. Iago does not desire Othello for his goodness. (What would that be, incidentally? Why should any person, on seeing that a second person is good, desire that person? There is a wider worry here, about whether the equation of "x is good" with "x is desired" will look equally plausible for all possible values of x.) Anyway, to repeat, Iago does not desire Othello for his goodness; Iago hates Othello for his goodness: "He hath a daily beauty in his life/ That makes me ugly" (Othello V.1.19).

Indeed Oddie himself mentions Iago (64), but not in this connection. Oddie misattributes to Iago Milton's Satan's "Evil, be thou my good" (Paradise Lost 4.108), and discusses that. (It is surprising that such a misattribution should not be picked up by OUP's readers. The moral is caveat auctor; authors, apparently, can no longer expect even the most esteemed publishers to spare their literary blushes as they might have hoped.) Iago (or rather Satan) looks like a counter-example of the second type to Oddie's equation of desiring x and experiencing x as good; for apparently Satan desires what he experiences as bad. In response, Oddie allows that Satan can desire what he believes to be evil, but not what he experiences as evil. "That does teeter on a contradiction" (66), unless it means that Satan wants, not {to desire evil and not to desire evil}, but {to desire what is evil and what is not evil}, which is not a contradiction, but a state of inner conflict (67). But here one still has the sense that there is an awkwardness in Oddie's descriptions which a different (and more realistic?) phenomenology might have avoided. Maybe Oddie should retreat a little, and simply allow the possibility of pure Satanic malice or Iago-istic envy, states in which one does desire what one experiences as evil. His main claim would then be the weaker claim that desiring x is typically experiencing x as good, even if it is not that by definition. (Perhaps rationally desiring x might still be defined as experiencing x as good.)

Let me turn, in closing, to the third question about Oddie's theory that I raised at the start -- his moral metaphysics. If goodness is a property which we can be causally affected by, then some kind of account of this property is needed; and Oddie has plenty to say to provide such an account, much of which I cannot discuss properly here. But let us note his interesting proposal about how to test for propertyhood, which he calls convexity (162-166). Roughly, on this test there is a property F-NESS wherever, for any two instances of the correct application of the predicate "… is F", there is a third instance of its correct application in between them. The difficulty here, of course, is to define what "in between" means. Oddie tries to define it by way of the contentious notion of a multidimensional similarity space. Hence, more formally, here are the conditions on which, according to Oddie's test, moral concepts correspond to moral properties:

1. Suppose A is a possible case that yields a correct application of a moral concept F.

2. Suppose B is another possible case that yields a correct application of the same moral concept F.

3. Suppose A and B are related by a line L in the similarity-space that contains them.

4. On these conditions, F is not just a moral concept but a property if and only if all possible cases intersected by L between A and B are cases that yield correct applications of the same moral concept F. (So the concept "justice" corresponds to a property JUSTICE if, e.g., punishment A is just in possible case 1, just in possible case 2, and just in all possible cases intermediate between cases 1 and 2 on the relevant similarity line.)

If the notion of a similarity-space can be accepted (which I doubt, but let that pass), then other queries remain. For one thing, at first sight it is tempting to suspect that Oddie's convexity test conflicts with moral particularism. We might say that if moral particularism is true, then for all we can tell there will be cases intermediate on L between A and B that do not yield F; hence the test gives the wrong results in such cases (or else, moral particularism has the unwelcome consequence that it casts doubt on the reality of moral properties).

However, a closer look at Oddie's test suggests that in fact it doesn't count against particularism in this way, because it doesn't count against anything much: it's simply too permissive in what it allows to be a property. If we set to one side the very extreme particularist view that there are never two cases "of the same moral concept" -- on which view Oddie's test will be permanently inapplicable -- then almost any moral concept at all will have a corresponding property by Oddie's test. This is because, for almost any concept at all that applies in one case, it will be possible to imagine a case like it such that convexity holds between the two cases. (To put it another way, there are simply too many possible similarity lines between cases.) Properties, then, will be abundant; it's just that some of the properties will be more rarely and more locally instantiated than others. The difference between real and unreal properties will transform into no more than the difference between common and unusual properties.

"So perhaps what we want to know is this: whether normative properties cover a lot of biggish convex similarity-spaces, or just a few small ones?" Unless we arbitrarily stipulate how much is a lot, and how big is biggish, this move won't give us a clear test for whether anything is a property or not. (Though it may give us a test for degrees of propertyness, which may be useful in itself.) Myself, I would prefer to define propertyhood by way of the notion of patterns. That would give us an abundant theory of properties, such as Oddie professes not to want; but then, as I have argued, Oddie is stuck with an abundant theory of properties anyway.

There is plenty more than this to say about Oddie's fine book; take, for instance, his discussion of Yablo's proposal in the philosophy of mind that non-physical determinables (like "the thought of cream cheese") may have physical determinates (like some brain-state), and his application of this proposal to the case of metaethics, to solve the difficulty about how non-natural moral properties might be causally efficacious in something rather like a buck-passing way (191-8). Oddie gives you something worth thinking about on almost every page, and I am envious of his ability to put complex ideas with crystal clarity. (At least some other philosophers should be even more envious than me.) For anyone who wants to think rigorously but creatively about the metaphysics and epistemology that moral realism needs to be plausible, this book is essential reading.