Value, Respect, and Attachment

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Raz, Joseph, Value, Respect, and Attachment, Cambridge University Press, 2001, vii+178pp, $19.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00022-X.

Reviewed by Edward Harcourt, University of Kent at Canterbury


Evaluative belief and practice are diverse. Sometimes this fact is due to error, but where it is not we should, according to Raz, ‘accept the legitimacy of difference’, taking ‘approving attitudes to normative practices which often appear inconsistent, or even positively hostile to each other’ (pp 11-12). The central task Raz sets himself in this short but richly stimulating book, based on his 2000 Seeley Lectures in Cambridge, is to make legitimate difference theoretically unproblematic while showing that it is consistent with his interpretation of the thesis that values are universal. Despite its brevity, the book contains searching discussions of, inter alia, the value of life and of respect for persons, which I can do no more than mention here.

Raz follows two different routes in pursuit of his central aims, the first via the notion of partiality and the second via the idea that at least some values are socially dependent. The argument that partiality is no threat to the universality of values includes a discussion of the rather under-discussed notions of meaning and attachment and of their relation to value, while the argument that partiality makes room for legitimate difference invokes a distinction between two ways of relating to what is valuable, respecting it (which we are required to do) and engaging with it (which it is intelligible that we should do, but not required). It is claims to our engagement which are liable to be rivalrous (sometimes appearing ‘positively hostile to one another’), but because genuine values rationally require only something weaker – respect – rivalry at this level does not cast doubt on the genuineness of the rivals. For reasons of space, however, I shall focus on Raz’s conception of value-universality itself and on the second of his two ways of theorizing legitimate difference, his claim that (some) values are universal even though socially dependent, and on the relation of this claim to the possibility of evaluative knowledge. In attempting to assess Raz’s treatment of these themes, I shall have two of Raz’s theoretical opponents, the particularist and the relativist, especially in mind.

1. On a certain ‘thin’ understanding of universality, Raz argues that values – that is, good- or bad-making properties – are either universal or subsumable under universal values, and that their universality is required by the fact that values are intelligible: for anything that is good or bad, necessarily there is an explanation available of why it is. The connecting step is that an explanation of goodness or badness is not satisfactory if it does not end up citing only properties which are, in the relevant ‘thin’ sense, universal, i.e. which are such that (a) they can be specified without singular references and (b) they can in principle be instantiated in any place at any time.

Let us agree with Raz that value is essentially intelligible – though it would be fascinating to unravel the metaphysical assumptions that are surely wrapped up in that claim – and that this requires that the value of things must always be capable of explanation. The step that is (to my mind) hard to argue for is the middle one, that adequate explanations of value must cite only properties that are universal in senses (a) and (b). Raz launches the claim that intelligibility requires universality intuitively by means of a dialogue: the interlocutor maintains to a bemused Raz that a film that was good yesterday is bad today, though nothing has changed except the day. Now this is indeed unintelligible, but it does not (it seems to me) show that ‘non-universal differences [sc., differences in respect of singular-referring properties] cannot explain evaluative differences’ (p 47). Remember that the interlocutor agrees that ‘nothing of relevance has happened’ (ibid.) between yesterday and today. Now if this is so, its having been some particular day yesterday cannot have been part of the interlocutor’s reason for saying yesterday that the film was good. Hence she is maintaining that the film has changed in value despite having changed only in respect of a property that on her own admission is irrelevant to its value. It is this, not the fact that the film has changed only in respect of a property that is singular-referring, that accounts for the unintelligibility of her attempted explanation. The same point can be made in a slightly different way by supposing that there is an iron suspension bridge that everyone agrees is beautiful thanks only to its shape and which changes slightly in color each time it is repainted. I agree with the consensus that only its shape matters to its beauty. One day we are passing and you say ‘isn’t it beautiful?’ I reply that it isn’t, though it was before. But what has changed? Only the color, I say. My judgment is unintelligible in just the same way as Raz’s interlocutor’s, though colors are not singular-referring properties. Conversely if the interlocutor had said (however bizarrely) that what made the film good yesterday was the fact that it was that particular day then, then she would not have said that the change of day was not ‘of relevance’, and her claim (today) that the film has become bad would not suffer from this especially flagrant kind of unintelligibility.

Of course the fact that it was that particular day then cannot, at least on its own, supply an intelligible explanation of the goodness of the film, but the fact that that singular-referring property cannot does not show that no such property can. So are there rock-bottom explanations of value, which cite singular-referring properties? The question itself may not be in order, for if (as Raz maintains) there is no reductively motivated pressure on explanations of value to reach outside the domain of the evaluative (p 49) and there is nothing such that its value cannot be explained (p 52), then the idea of a rock-bottom explanation of value is problematic (though Raz says that some values are ‘foundational’, p 8). But if it is, it is not clear which point in the chain of explanations we are to inspect to make sure that singular-referring properties are absent from it. Indeed the whole question of what counts as an adequate explanation of value is problematic: can’t adequate explanations of value sometimes consist in providing examples, or are explanations by example always mere stand-ins for explanations which cite properties? (Think also of Wittgenstein’s idea that one can explain the beauty of a melody by humming it with the right phrasing.) The implication of Raz’s general anti-reductionist stance – the thought being that whenever we start explaining the value of something we are already, as it were, up to our necks in value – seems to me to go against the idea that there is a canonical form of explanation of value.

Setting these worries aside, let us see if we can come up with a bona fide singular-referring explanation of value. A church may be valued by its admirers in part because of the spot of land on which it sits, a fact which can be observed in the wholly understandable outrage caused by a construction company’s proposal to move the church a short distance away to make room for a new road: as Raz observes rightly and often, meaning ‘comes through a common history’ (e.g. p 20). The idea is not that the spot is a good spot because on no other spot would the light shine through the stained-glass windows in the particularly beautiful way it does (which would be to back up the singular-referring explanation of the value of the church by appeal to a non-singular-referring property). For let us suppose that the neighboring field in which the church’s original builders might very well have built it is indistinguishable from the actual spot in respect of all properties with the exception of its (singular-referring) location. Is (part of) the explanation of the church’s value not therefore simply that it is on that spot, i.e. that it possesses a singular-referring property? No: the good-making property is rather the (non-singular-referring) property that the church shares with many other sacred and other buildings, which are on the spot they have always been on, and thanks to which the church now has a historic and value-conferring connection with that spot, which it would not have to any substitute. It seems that there is after all something unintelligible about saying that the change in value is due only to the change in location (though not because the location is not ‘of relevance’). However, it would be good to have something more than the defeat of successive attempted counterexamples to support this.

The church example points towards the idea that value-explanations must be universal in sense (a), but what about sense (b)? Unless I have misunderstood the force of Raz’s ‘in principle’ in (b), there are many things – especially those which move frequently – of which it is not true that they could, at any place and any time, instantiate the property of being on the spot they have always been on. But does the fact that the explanation of the church’s value is not universal in sense (b) affect its intelligibility? I do not think so, and this raises the suspicion (which I explore further below) that condition (b) is redundant. Raz might reply that the non-universality in sense (b) of the property being on the spot it has always been on is no counterexample to the thesis that values are universal, on the grounds that the property in question is not an evaluative property, and the universality thesis is intended to apply to evaluative properties only. That we are not to count it as an evaluative property seems confirmed by Raz’s explication of the notion of an evaluative property on p 43 as ‘any property which (necessarily) makes anything which possesses it good (or bad) at least to a degree’ which, in the light of p 43 n 2, I read in the sense of ‘any property such that everything which possesses it is thereby made good or bad at least to a degree’. For while it is certainly plausible to argue (against the particularist) that selfishness, which explains the badness (say) of my now hogging the sofa, makes every action that instantiates it pro tanto bad, it is surely absurd to claim that being on the spot it has always been on makes everything that instantiates it (unmown blades of grass?) pro tanto good. The problem for Raz is that explaining the value of the church by appeal to the (non-evaluative) being on the spot it has always been on – compare also explaining the beauty of a sculpture by appeal to its shape, the way the polished stone catches the light etc. – does not seem inadequate as compared to explaining the disvalue of hogging the sofa by appeal to (evaluative) selfishness. But if adequate explanations of value needn’t always cite evaluative properties – though is aesthetic value the only exception here? if so, I don’t know why – then the necessary intelligibility of value won’t imply that every property cited in explanations of value (i.e. every good-making property) must satisfy Raz’s two criteria of universality, even if evaluative properties (on Raz’s understanding of what makes a property evaluative) must.

Let’s suppose, however, that all good-making properties do make anything which possesses them good at least to a degree. Does this feature of good-making properties, denied by the particularist, require that they be universal in sense (b)? Apparently not: a property could necessarily be good-making wherever it is instantiated even though the times and places of its possible instantiation are quite restricted. The positive aesthetic properties of English-language films in the ‘Bollywood’ style are (let’s say, pace the particularist) good-making whenever anything has them, but it looks as if some of them could not have been possessed by anything before the social conditions for the production of such cultural hybrids came about. Raz’s reply to this type of objection (pp 72-3) – that the properties in question could have been instantiated at any time, because the social conditions for their possible instantiation could have come about at any time (though they only in fact came about at a particular time) – looks to have the invalid form ‘It is possible at all times that it is possible that p, so it is possible at all times that p’. But does this matter? No, at least if Raz’s opponent here is the particularist, if particularism can be ruled out without insisting on universality in sense (b).

2. The diversity of values poses a threat to their universality via a familiar argument (or type of argument) against the possibility of evaluative knowledge. The core idea of the familiar argument – and Raz (p 62) rightly hesitates as to whether to characterize it as skeptical or irrealist in intent, since it surely cannot be both – is that we can speak of knowledge in a given domain only if we can speak of error, and that genuine error must be accountable for in terms of failures in our sensitivity (in some relevant sense) to what the alleged knowledge-claims are about. We are then said to fail this test with regard to the domain of values on the grounds that belief about values is sensitive to social practice and thus, by implication, not to values themselves. Raz exploits the familiar argument in a complex way. First, he advances what he calls the ‘reversal’ of the familiar argument. But this move turns out simply to be by way of constructing an apparently compelling challenge to his own position on value-universality, which he then proceeds to argue cannot be made good.

The reversal argument sometimes seems to go like this: Evaluative knowledge is possible. So, granted the general epistemological premises of the familiar argument plus the fact that belief about values is sensitive to social practice, value is socially dependent. For only if value depends constitutively on social facts can the sensitivity of value-beliefs to social practice qualify, by the lights of the familiar argument, as evaluative knowledge. (‘The reversal argument starts by … accepting the objectivity of values, and the possibility of knowledge about values’, p 63; ‘we can provisionally accept the reversal argument as a powerful argument for the dependence of some intrinsic values on the social’, p 71.) But this way of ‘reversing’ the familiar argument is puzzling, since I cannot find an argument anywhere in the book for its first premise, viz. the possibility of evaluative knowledge. Elsewhere in the book, however, the direction of the reversal argument is presented rather differently: (some) value is constitutively dependent on the social (and I cannot rehearse Raz’s arguments in support of that premise here), so knowledge of value is possible (‘sensitivity of our beliefs about value to culture [sometimes] constitutes … sensitivity to the reality of value, which is what we need … to establish the possibility of knowledge of value’, p 66). That is a highly ingenious argument for an important conclusion.

But has the possibility of knowledge been bought at too high a price? The question is ‘Too high for what?’ Raz notes that one of the difficulties in successfully theorizing legitimate difference is the standing attraction of a relativist solution (p 12). Now for some, relativism is a meta-ethical thesis, which excludes the idea that evaluative claims are candidates for plain truth. (Of course being relative is just one way of failing to be plain.) But if there can be no plain truth in matters of value, then there can be no knowledge of value either, so armed with what I think we should take as the conclusion of the reversal argument – that there can be evaluative knowledge – Raz would already have enough to see off that kind of relativist. Indeed, the relativist would be seen off not in spite of but thanks to what appeared to be his trump card, the social dependence of value. From the point of view of defeating this relativist, then, the effects of the reversal argument on the thesis of the universality of value are neither here nor there.

The relativist Raz has in his sights, however, is one for whom ‘the rejection of the universality of values is the very essence’ of his position (p 12). So it’s an urgent question whether the argument for evaluative knowledge is consistent with the universality of value. One may wonder – though perhaps it’s a somewhat verbal issue – whether such a position is helpfully seen as a variety of relativism. For one might say that the relativist’s characteristic claim is that F-ness as instantiated at p at t is only relatively good, and though this implies that not everyone everywhere who believes that F-ness is not good as instantiated at p at t need be seen as making a mistake, it is neutral on whether F-ness can or cannot be instantiated at all other times and places. Indeed Raz’s relativist (unless I have misread him here) turns out to be identical with the particularist: as Raz says, if value is socially dependent, ‘values vary with social facts, and these facts are mere contingent facts’ (p 71), so the worry is that the reversal argument yields ‘a proof of particularism’. The basic outline of Raz’s reply to this worry is that ‘the foundational moral values are universally valid in abstract form but they manifest themselves in ways which are socially dependent, and become accessible to us in ways that are socially dependent’ (p 8). Now if this reply is enough to show the universality of values (and again it is universality in sense (b) that is at issue here), then Raz has no need to rely on the argument, criticized above, that relatively specific socially dependent value-properties could be instantiated at any time because the social conditions for their possible instantiation could come about at any time. But the reply is surely not enough: the value of a certain culturally local type of social relationship may indeed be an instance of the more abstract value of friendship, but unless we are to give up on the social dependence of value, its being an instance of the more abstract value isn’t all there is to its being valuable (‘variant practices exemplifying but at the same time modifying the more abstract values which bred them’, p 3; my italics). But again, Raz need not be worried. The reversal argument can be admitted to yield a proof that values are not universal in sense (b), but since the particularist (as I understand it) is committed only to denying the claim that a property which makes something pro tanto good makes anything which possesses it pro tanto good and that claim does not require (b), the reversal argument does not yield a proof of particularism.