Vanishing Into Things

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Barry Allen, Vanishing Into Things, Harvard University Press, 2015, 289pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674335912.

Reviewed by Henry Rosemont, Jr., Brown University


Western scholarship on Chinese philosophy has been broadening and deepening for several decades now, and is beginning to be taken seriously in many of the philosophy departments in the United States. The major reason for this interest is not simply China's rise to economic power -- much of the scholarship preceded it -- but because it became increasingly apparent to many comparative philosophers that earlier translators and interpreters of the classical Chinese texts were employing a specific vocabulary of Western philosophical terms when translating the Chinese, which of course meant that the early masters were not able to speak in their own voices, and worse, made them appear not very sophisticated as philosophers compared to their Western brethren.

 Barry Allen's book is an excellent example of this recent and highly salutary new orientation in comparative philosophical research. The title initially suggests that it is a study of Chinese zhiguai (志 怪), "Records of Anomalies," or "Tales of the Miraculous," an unusual genre earlier analyzed by Robert Campany in his Strange Writing (SUNY Press 1996). Allen's focus is very different, however, for he examines the several ways pre-modern Chinese thinkers discussed and described the relation between knowledge and wisdom, and how these contrasted with similar accounts of that relation in the history of Western philosophy. What makes his book particularly valuable in my opinion is that he argues well that we must now go beyond merely learning about the Chinese, to accepting that we can learn much from them, especially, but not confined to the relation between knowledge and its uses -- or misuses.

The title -- which Allen says was suggested to him by Brook Ziporyn's translation of ming (冥) as "vanishing" -- describes the outcome of knowledge as it becomes wisdom in China. Initially opaque, it does begin to make sense as Allen proceeds with his narrative, and becomes more fitting as his account progresses. In his own words, "To vanish into things is to interact with them without obstructive, forceful desires, or 'self.' To achieve this trackless mind is to overcome the mind, to reach no-mind (wu xin) [無 心]" (p. 104). Or again,

"vanishing into things" epitomizes the accomplishment of sage knowledge as understood in most of the Chinese thought I discuss. The kernel idea is the loss of 'self,' which is understood not substantively, as an entity, but in terms of desire and the folly of individuation. (p. 107)

It must be noted that Allen intends his description to be taken generally, and what he is talking about has little to do with the self-less wisdom associated with Buddhist meditative practices, as we will see below.

In making his case(s) he covers a fairly extensive temporal period, from the Warring States period through the Ming Dynasty, concentrating on five intellectual traditions: 1) the early Confucians (Confucius, Mengzi and Xunzi); 2) early Daoists (the Laozi and Zhuangzi); 3) military writings (mostly Sunzi); 4) Chan Buddhism; and 5) Song-Ming Neo-Confucianism, divided almost equally between the Song thinker Zhu Xi and his Ming successor (and commentarial critic) Wang Yangming. Allen has thus cast his net widely over a variety of Chinese texts, but he has cast it well in my opinion, capturing many insights from each of them in a manner equally competent sinologically and philosophically. Much of the time he is comparing and contrasting the ideas under examination with references to one or more relevant Western counterparts as an integral part of his analyses, especially Plato, Aristotle and Nietzsche, and some modern continental figures like Gilles Deleuze.

But Allen makes clear that he is not looking for parallels with them so much as contrasts, for he appreciates well that we will look in vain, for example, about how Chinese thinkers thought about essences, and about being (stasis) -- two fundamental concepts throughout the history of Western philosophy since Plato -- instead perceiving, correctly in my opinion, that the Chinese were thinking against an ontological background of transformation and becoming (change). Thus knowledge (and wisdom) was much more about events and processes in China, than things. These latter concepts were central to all of the "Hundred Schools" of classical Chinese philosophy, and we will understand them only as we come to understand how the philosophers all debated how human beings should best live. Not, as in the West, seeking and contemplating knowledge of eternal verities, but rather living a life that accommodated the only constant in Chinese thought: change. For Confucius as well as for Zhuangzi the goal was to live in accord with the principles of wu wei actions; learning to "Go with the flow" at all times.

This is a primary example of how the study of Chinese philosophy has grown more sophisticated in the West. Wu wei 無 为 used to be translated as "inaction" or "non-action," both of which sound odd to a non-Chinese in answer to the question of how one should lead one's life. Now, however, the phrase is rendered more as "effortless action." This is a felicitous term, for knowledge in China has always been as closely linked to action as it has been distinct from it in the West. Only by appreciating the difference between the translations can we hope to understand that, how and why the early Chinese philosophers debated as they did, addressing the question of how most appropriately to cultivate oneself so as to act always with "wu wei effectiveness" -- Allen's expression for sagely behavior (p. 24). And we can appreciate in turn more of the specifics of the debates by an awareness of the shared metaphysical assumptions of the disputants -- reflecting processural transformation and becoming rather than essence and being -- when wu xing 五行ceased being rendered as the "Five Elements" in favor of "Five Phases."

As he describes the several groups of thinkers basic to his survey, Allen keeps the reader's attention drawn to the fact that engaging in wu wei effectiveness is a lifetime activity. It is not a goal to be achieved, after which the sage is in equilibrium. Self-cultivation is a life-long endeavor, because change never ceases; human beings are always changing no less than nature, along with the course of events.

Allen also makes clear why, for all the Chinese thinkers, knowledge only becomes true wisdom when utilized in action, unselfconsciously and spontaneously -- and hence is impartial. At first glance this point may appear very similar to the impartiality -- or even better, objectivity -- demanded by the seeker of knowledge in Western philosophy. But the Chinese cultivate these qualities for the sake of acting on knowledge rather than simply acquiring it. They will be effortless and in accord with the way things should be. And such actions conduce to the good, both personal and social, for the road to sagehood reflects an increasing ability to discern changes when they are still incipient, and modify them naturally as much as possible for the good of the community. At first blush this may seem a straightforward account of Daoist thought, but Allen also uses the expression "wu-wei effectiveness" to characterize the Confucians, military thinkers, and the Neo-Confucians as well, quoting the Song Dynasty philosopher Cheng Hao, "For the exemplary person [junzi], nothing is better than being impersonal and impartial, and responding to events as they come" (p. 182).

 This focus on actions, activity -- events and the relations between them, often cyclical -- is ontologically fundamental to the Chinese, just as substances are ontically basic in the West. This difference is not only reflected in the different ways philosophy was done in the two cultures, but science as well. Scholarship has long since put paid to the chauvinistic question of "Why didn't China develop science?" but it remains that certain sciences in each culture have no close counterparts in the other. The distinguished scholar of Chinese science and medicine Nathan Sivin has an explanation of why this was so:

Scientific thought began, in China as elsewhere, with attempts to comprehend how it is that although individual things are constantly changing, always coming to be and perishing, nature as a coherent order not only endures, but remain conformable to itself. In the West the earliest such attempts identified the unchanging reality with some basic stuff out of which all of the things around us, despite their apparent diversity, are formed. In China the earliest and in the long run the most influential scientific explanations were in terms of time. They made sense of the momentary event by fitting it into the cyclical rhythms of natural processes.1

It may initially be difficult to see how the Chinese could view the world in this way. Our presupposition -- not assumption -- that the world is made up basically of physical objects -- has psychological no less than philosophical underpinnings: even though at an abstract level we know better, it is very hard for us not to think of a Higgs boson as a very, very, very small bit of matter, but matter nevertheless. Allen draws on the writings of the Ming Neo-Confucian scholar Luo Qinshun to give us a different orientation:

The real relations in nature are becoming and processes, neither finished fully present facts nor imaginary fictions. Hume asks what a real relation could be. The answer is nothing. Not because no relations are real, but because the reality of relations is the reality of a becoming, not a being. And the reason that is quite simply that time is real. What is real about time? Interval, duration, multiplicity becoming related. (pp. 208-09)

After reading this book, it will, I believe, be difficult for anyone to not see epistemology in a somewhat different light, perhaps to review their ontological assumptions, and to not want to rethink the field of ethics as well if hoping to achieve a global reach. In his closing chapter "Resonance," Allen makes a strong case for our need to appreciate at a deep level the Chinese linking of wisdom with action by linking knowledge with ethics. Our own standard view that knowledge is sufficient for wisdom, he claims, might have seemed reasonable to the Greeks, but has lost all plausibility with the explosion of knowledge in the modern era, with wisdom in as short supply as ever. In modern society, he says (by way of implicitly challenging the is/ought distinction):

the good use of knowledge is counterproductively dampened by the ethical indifference of those who pursue the work of inquiry, including you and me. We do not care as we should about the ethical use of knowledge. We do not know how to care, how to express such care, to whom, or with what arguments. (p. 224)

This is a rather strong claim. Many people have sought knowledge in order to make the world a better place and improve the lot of humankind, from labor-saving devices (Watt, McCormick) to medicine (Fleming, Salk, Bethune), to government and history (Zinn, Chomsky). A paradigmatic example of the problem for Allen might be Bertrand Russell, who always insisted on the pursuit of knowledge in philosophy being altogether distinct from ethics, while yet being arrested for civil disobedience protesting nuclear weapons as a nonagenarian (long after having been incarcerated for pacifism during World War I). How could the two be unrelated?

Readers will not only learn much about Chinese thought from this book, but will see important elements of their own intellectual heritage in a different way. Allen hopes this will lead to making philosophy as truly global in the future as it has mistakenly been thought to be in the past. (p. 232).  In sum, a splendid book, a pleasure to read. Philosophy as a discipline is better for having it,.

1 "Chinese Alchemy and the Manipulation of Time," in Science and Technology in East Asia, edited by Nathan Sivin. Sagamore Beach, MA: Science History Publications, 1977, p. 110.