Variations on Truth: Approaches in Contemporary Phenomenology

Placeholder book cover

Pol Vandevelde and Kevin Hermberg (eds.), Variations on Truth: Approaches in Contemporary Phenomenology, Continuum, 2011, 238pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441112903.

Reviewed by Adam Konopka, College of Mount St. Joseph


In a 2009 online survey by PhilPapers, almost half (48.9%) of the 1803 philosophy faculty or PhD participants answered that they "accepted or leaned toward" a correspondence theory of truth. According to the survey, in other words, about half of professional philosophers today are committed to some version of the view that, broadly speaking, the truths of beliefs and judgments consist in relations to actual states of affairs. A belief or judgment is said to be true, in this view, if it conforms to a fact or some feature of the world. The other half of the philosophers surveyed did not think that the issue is that straightforward and their responses ran the gamut of a variety of competing approaches to the question of truth such as coherentist, deflationary, and epistemic theories. The contributors to Variations on Truth are part of the other half of this perennial problem.

The volume brings philosophical resources from the phenomenological and hermeneutic traditions to contribute to contemporary developments of alternatives to conventional correspondence theories of truth. These traditions tend to resist a basic assumption of such theories -- that truth is reducible to or fundamentally targets the content of beliefs or propositions about the world. One of the basic problems with this assumption from the perspective of many of the volume's contributors is that it construes truth in an external relation between propositional or belief content and world. From a phenomenological or hermeneutic perspective that takes seriously a theory of intentionality, truth does not consist in an external relation between content and world, but is given in and through their internal unity. Many of the contributors thus make an ontological association with truth, which is to say that truth names this more fundamental process of "disclosure" of the content of the world, so to speak. They also tend to advocate for a coherentist epistemology that attempts to ultimately justify the veracity of a particular content in terms of its relation to other contents.

While the chapters incline toward presenting some version of a deflationary and coherentist alternative to the mainstream view, there are nevertheless important differences among them. The different approaches to the ontological and epistemological features of the question of truth hinge on a long-standing debate between phenomenology and hermeneutics concerning the role of interpretation in the description of phenomena. I will consider this debate in more detail below, but suffice it to say at this point that the title -- Variations on Truth -- accurately reflects a plurality of approaches and concerns that are loosely centered on the book's theme.

This is the second volume in a Continuum series entitled "Issues in Phenomenology and Hermeneutics" that takes a welcome "issues oriented" approach to contemporary research in fields that often tend to overly focus on historical debates among figures. Several of the international contributors were participants in a Seminar on Phenomenology and Hermeneutics at Marquette University that was sponsored by Marquette's Helen Way Klingler College of Arts and Sciences (Milwaukee) and Dominican College (New York). As with many conference paper publications, the quality of contributions varies, some seeming unchanged from their oral presentation. Nevertheless, the volume contributes a valuable glimpse into current research of leading and emerging scholars from North America, France, Germany, and Spain. The following analysis will focus on those contributions that most directly engage the volume's theme.

Analogous to the way in which contemporary correspondence theories of truth can be traced back to the early twentieth century, particularly to the work of G. E. Moore and Bertrand Russell, the ongoing debate between phenomenology and hermeneutics can be traced back to an early twentieth century debate between Edmund Husserl and Martin Heidegger. As Pol Vandevelde recounts this debate in the preface and introduction, the "hermeneutic challenge" to a phenomenological conception of truth concerns the role of language and, subsequently, interpretation in describing the intentional correlates between the subjective and objective features of experience. From the perspective of a Husserlian theory of intentionality, the questions of the truth or falsity of judgments are initially answered through an appeal to prepredicative evidence concerning the givenness of objects of experience.

For example, the judgment "I think my laptop is in my backpack" is justified by finding my backpack, opening it, and simply discovering my laptop. When my laptop is intuitively given as I initially intended it in the judgment, my belief is evidenced as true. Indeed, for Husserl, truth consists in the process of evidence that emerges in the progression from an empty to a fulfilling intention, which is to say more broadly, that the question of truth is answered with a theory of justification. More specifically, truth consists in the identification or synthesis of coincidence (Deckung) between two acts: 1) the signitive intention of the judgment, e.g., that the laptop is in the backpack, and 2) the perceptual intention, e.g., the visual and tactile discovery of the laptop. The coincidence, it should be noted, is not between a subjective belief and a mind-independent object that are ontologically distinct (as it is in conventional correspondence theories of truth), but rather between two intentions, e.g., those involved in the judgment and the perception.

The chapters composing the first substantive section, "Husserlian Resources: Reduction, Imagination, Transcendental Idealism," explore several methodological issues that are associated with Husserl's concept of truth. Dominique Pradelle explores how the phenomenological reduction insures that the phenomenological appeal to experience does not remain encapsulated in experience but leads to scientific and logical claims. John Brough consider the relationship between imagination and perception in the synthesis of a variety of profiles of an object. Jean-François Lavigne analyzes Husserl's understanding of the relationship between the operative epistemological realism of the "natural attitude" and the second-order justification of that realism that, for Husserl, took the form of a transcendental idealism. The adept treatments of some of the central methodological features of Husserl's phenomenology by these prominent scholars provide a glimpse into current research in the field. However, the reader quickly realizes that these articles only loosely relate to the volume's theme and seem to fail to fulfill the expressed editorial goal of being "issues oriented" as opposed to close expositions of a historical figure's work. The failure here, in other words, is an editorial one that neglects to bring the methodological concerns related to the phenomenological reduction, image consciousness, and transcendental idealism more directly to bear on the problem of truth.

The contributions that develop the "hermeneutic challenge" to phenomenology are more focused. As Vandevelde relates in his introduction, the debate concerns the role of language in the description of the process of evidence. From a hermeneutic perspective, Husserl's original position took for granted that the descriptions of intentional fulfillments that comprise evidence occur in a medium of articulation (e.g., language) that is not merely transparent or neutral but fundamentally contributes to the process of how objects are given. If intentionality for Husserl implied, as it were, that all seeing is seeing of an object that is given for a subject, it is nevertheless also the case that all seeing is seeing as. We understand objects in and through language, and these linguistically mediated understandings inform the process of intentional fulfillment such that this process itself involves an accomplishment of interpretation. For example, the discovery of my laptop in my backpack was already informed by my pre-understanding of what a laptop looks like, how valuable it is, and how to use it. In the process of discovering it, I see the laptop as a laptop. This introduction of what Hans-Georg Gadamer called "the mediation of language" (Sprachlichkeit) to the process of manifestation represents the so-called "hermeneutic turn" in the early and mid-twentieth century.

What does this emphasis on the role of language and interpretation have to do with truth? From a Heideggerean perspective, truth names this linguistically mediated process of manifestation or disclosure, which is to say, truth is an event of pre-theoretical disclosure that fundamentally occurs in and through language. Not only does this conception of truth implicitly challenge the validity of pre-predicative experience, but it ultimately leads to versions of coherentist theories of justification. In short, if objects are disclosed in and through languages that condition our pre-understandings and inherently are interpretative accomplishments (all seeing is seeing as), then the justification of a given interpretation will occur through its agreement with broader sets of interpretation.

The chapters of the second main section, "Heideggerean Variations: Dasein's Opening, Disclosure, and the History of Being," provide close textual expositions of Heidegger's work between the late 1920s and the early 1940s. Burt Hopkins argues (successfully in my view) against Heidegger's hermeneutic critique that the reflective and eidetic method of Husserlian phenomenology is "incapable of overcoming its ontological limitations." Hopkins identifies a hidden and unjustified presupposition in Heidegger's prioritization of the question of Being and its exclusiveness with theoretical forms of analysis. László Tengelyi examines the concept of "openness" as a form of pre-predicative truth in Heidegger's so-called "metaphysical period" between 1927 and 1930. The Heidegger that Tengelyi presents tempers the linguistic dimension of the hermeneutic critique in an interesting and provocative way, connecting the intersubjective features of the question of truth with world-formation (rather than language). It is by the comportment to a common world, Tengelyi argues, that pre-predicative truth is communal (rather than intersubjectively informed through language). Vandevelde, in a second contribution, compares Heidegger and Plato on 1) the gradation of being (e.g., Plato's divided line) to which they both seem to adhere, and 2) the ontological role that language plays for Heidegger with Plato's theory of ideas.

The remaining sections, "Toward a Broadened Ontology and Epistemology: Nature, Judgment, and Intersubjectivity" and "The Avatars of Truth: Deconstruction, Conversation, and Interpretation," explore several of the subsequent implications of the hermeneutic challenge to phenomenology and include analyses of Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Hegel, and contemporary social epistemology. These explorations illustrate that phenomenology and hermeneutics are not philosophical positions in themselves but methodological approaches that open possibilities for a variety of positions. Consider, for example, two Heideggerean inspired chapters by Santiago Zabala and Daniel Dahlstrom, which begin from similar starting points but significantly diverge regarding the role of truth in the process of interpretation.

Zabala's hermeneutics is one in which the concern regarding the truth of an interpretation gives way to an understanding of Being as a "conversation." Interpretations that grasp at the origin or essence of truth entangle philosophy in a metaphysics of correspondence, rather than allowing the disclosure of Being as its own justification. As Zabala puts it, "from a philosophical position advocating the interpretative nature of truth, hermeneutics has become an ontological account of the remains of Being where truth ceases to have any normative power" (202). Dahlstrom's hermeneutics, however, would (rightly, in my view) take issue with this reduction of truth to interpretation. In perhaps the best chapter of the volume, he argues that indeed truth (understood as a coherence of interpretation) plays a regulative role in the process of interpretation. He defends what he calls a "qualified reductive thesis" which states "the truth of an interpretation is the coherence of its overriding meaning with the meanings of the interpretatum or interpretata (the thing or things already interpreted) that are part of the constitution of the interpretandum" (214). This means that truth as coherence provides a criterion of interpretation by 1) restricting the subject matter of interpretation, 2) affirming an overriding or holistic meaning, e.g., of a work of art, and 3) entailing that a particular interpretation is not internal to the interpretation itself.

Taken as a whole, one of the volume's basic strengths is the development of hermeneutic approaches to truth as various forms of coherence. One of the correlative weaknesses, from my perspective, is that many of the hermeneutic contributions operate with dated or underdeveloped conceptions of truth in non-hermeneutic phenomenology. Husserlian phenomenology is still criticized, for example, in the way that the hermeneutic challenge was originally formulated in the mid-twentieth century, even though we now know that, thanks to extensive posthumous publications, Husserl's work provides additional resources to respond to this challenge. More specifically, the consideration of a mature phenomenological perspective provides for an inclusion of the interpretative "as structure" of experience to be incorporated with "of," "for," and "in" structures of intentionality as it was originally formulated.

Sure, all seeing is seeing as, but it is also a seeing of something or some state of affairs, that is given for a subject in a world common to all. By overemphasizing the "as structure" of experience, some forms of hermeneutics, e.g., Zabala's, underdetermine these other structures. This easily slips into an anti-realism that claims that the intelligibility of the world is language-dependent, which is to say that understanding the world is embodied in the set of conceptual structures derived from the language we use to speak about it. When this becomes the hermeneutic position, we have given into what Husserl called "the seduction of language." By contrast, Husserlian phenomenology today offers possibilities of thinking about truth that provide for the clarification of the hermeneutic as structure while being able to account for differences between 1) relevant cohering meanings and 2) empty and fulfilling intuitions that coincide with the nature of the positing. This means, in short, that the coherence among interpretations is regulated by and rooted in the justifications we can give about the things about which we talk.