Varieties of Logic

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Stewart Shapiro, Varieties of LogicOxford University Press, 2014, 226pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199696529.

Reviewed by Shawn Standefer, Auburn University


In this book, Stewart Shapiro develops a new kind of logical pluralism, one that embraces a kind of relativism about logical consequence and that accepts classically inconsistent theories that other views reject. It is a rich book, which, apart from contributions to logical pluralism, makes connections between the philosophy of logic, philosophy of language, philosophy of math, and epistemology. I will briefly summarize the contents before situating Shapiro's pluralism with respect to another kind of logical pluralism and presenting some criticisms and comments.

The first chapter explores and settles many terminological issues surrounding relativism and pluralism. The kind of relativism with which Shapiro is concerned is folk-relativism, adapted from work by Crispin Wright. Folk-relativism about X is the claim that there is no such thing as simply being X. One must indicate the independent thing upon which being X depends. Shapiro endorses folk-relativism about logical consequence, or validity.

Pluralism about a subject matter is the claim that there are at least two different accounts of that subject matter that are equally good or correct. Monism, by contrast, is the claim that there is a unique good or correct account of that subject. Shapiro notes that folk-relativism about logical consequence, which he endorses, gives rise to a kind of pluralism, his logical pluralism.

In chapter 2, Shapiro considers many ways in which pluralism or relativism may arise in logic; one that receives lengthy discussion is the conception of logical consequence. Shapiro considers nine different conceptions of logical consequence and how they figure in the philosophy of logic. He ultimately says that, even though they may be incompatible, they all correctly characterize an aspect of logical consequence, which leads to a kind of pluralism. Shapiro then discusses other approaches to logical pluralism. I will address some of his comments on Beall and Restall (2006) after the summary.

Chapter 3 introduces Shapiro's logical pluralism, eclectic pluralism, to adopt his terminology. Eclectic pluralism accepts that there is a variety of logics because there is a variety of fruitful mathematical theories whose underlying logics are non-classical. Shapiro adopts a Hilbertian perspective according to which these theories are all legitimate mathematical theories if they are consistent, or, more generally, non-trivial. The logics of the theories, too, are legitimate logics.

Shapiro's motivating examples are three intuitionistic theories: Heyting Arithmetic plus Church's Thesis (HA+CT), intuitionistic analysis with free-choice sequences, and smooth infinitesimal analysis. I will focus on HA+CT for this review. The axioms of Heyting Arithmetic are those of Peano Arithmetic with the classical material conditional replaced by the intuitionistic conditional. Church's Thesis, here, is a schema saying that if a binary relation is functional, then there is a Turing machine that computes the output for a given input.[1] All three theories are consistent, but they turn inconsistent in the face of classical logic. The intuitive reason is that weaker logics allow for more distinctions to be drawn, since some entailments that are valid classically will not be valid in the weaker logic.[2] This permits one to strengthen a theory with the addition of axioms in a way that is classically inconsistent; the addition of Church's Thesis is just such a case.

A classical monist can make sense of HA+CT by using a modal translation of the theory into classical logic. This translation can be employed with the other two theories, but the result, Shapiro argues, strains intelligibility. Shapiro suggests that these theories are best understood by employing intuitionistic logic and working with the theory directly, rather than using a translation into classical logic.

In chapter 4, Shapiro turns to the question of whether the eclectic perspective entails relativism about validity, and, if so, what validity is relative to and how the relativism is to be understood. The contexts of use for the concept of validity, and so what validity is relative to, are mathematical structures and theories. The issue of relativism itself depends on whether the logical connectives have the same meaning or different meanings in different contexts. Shapiro is non-committal on this question, and he carefully works through both options. If the meaning of the logical connectives is the same across contexts, then "validity" should receive one sort of contextualist treatment, while it should receive a different sort of contextualist treatment if the meaning of the logical connectives differs across contexts. The two options are well motivated and well argued, but I would have liked to have heard more about how these options mattered for issues concerning logical pluralism.

In chapter 5, Shapiro argues that the matter of whether the logical connectives have the same meaning in different contexts is itself context-sensitive. The idea is that "same meaning" is context-sensitive in the same way that "same height" is context-sensitive. Shapiro adapts his context-sensitive treatment of vagueness to provide a way of understanding the context-sensitivity of "same meaning" that navigates important differences between the concepts of meaning and height.

In the next two chapters, Shapiro considers what pluralism about logical consequence means for meta-theoretic investigations, including foundational views. Meta-theory is developed in a particular logic, and so pluralism about logic leads to pluralism about meta-theory. This extends to foundational theories as well, about which Shapiro says, "There is no overwhelming need to have what we seem in the (restricted) case of classical mathematics: a single foundation that encompasses it all" (180, emphasis in the original). The discussion of this idea was tantalizing, albeit brief, and it would have been great to hear more about it, although properly following up would have required a substantive detour through the philosophy of mathematics.

In the penultimate chapter, Shapiro considers whether different meta-theories all agree on consequence for object language theories.[3] Focusing on a collection of relatively common logics, the answer is that sometimes the logic of the meta-theory matters and sometimes it does not. Several examples of each are supplied. An example of when the meta-theoretic logic does not matter is a simple statement of deductive validity, such as A A v B, about which all the options Shapiro considers agree.

Disjunctive syllogism in theories based on a relevant logic provides an example of when the logic of the meta-theory matters for verdicts of logical consequence. Disjunctive syllogism is the rule that if ~A and A v B are theorems, then so is B. It is not a primitive rule of relevant theories, but it has been shown that some common relevant theories are closed under this rule.[4] The usual proofs, however, use disjunctive syllogism, which is classically valid but doesn't pass muster relevantly.[5] There are no known proofs that are valid in relevant logic, so classical and relevant meta-theories may differ on whether B is a consequence of a given relevant theory, when ~A and A ∨ B both are.

The book concludes with a brief, lucid summary chapter. That is a bare outline of the contents, and there is much I left out, including discussions of analyticity, the open texture of concepts, logic as modeling, and verbal disputes.

In the rest of this review, I will raise a few questions for Shapiro's view, in order to clarify it and highlight some of its distinctive features. In doing so, it will be helpful to use Beall and Restall's pluralism as a foil. Following that discussion, I will close with one point concerning Shapiro's Hilbertian perspective. Let us turn to a brief summary of Beall and Restall's view.

Beall and Restall (2006) present a model-theoretic account of logical pluralism based on the Generalized Tarski Thesis (GTT), which says that an argument is validx iff in all casesx, if the premises are true, then the conclusion is true. Pluralism comes from specifying different collections of cases, and so this is an instance of Shapiro's folk-relativism. Beall and Restall end up with a few collections of cases (worlds, construction stages, and situations) that in turn specify a few logics (classical logic, intuitionistic logic, and first-degree entailment). On their view, logical consequence relations are normative, providing norms for reasoning, and they are formal.[6]

Beall and Restall are led to reject intuitionistic mathematical theories that are inconsistent with classical logic, although they can, and do, accept some theories whose underlying logic is non-classical but which are consistent with classical logic, such as constructive analysis. The reason is that excluded middle, A ~A, is a necessary truth on their view, and the addition of it to intuitionistic logic results in classical logic. The rejection of these theories is an important point for Shapiro, and it leads to my first comment.

Shapiro's book responds, in part, to Beall and Restall (2006). Shapiro says, "in a sense, the present study begins where Beall and Restall leave off" (38). One should not interpret him as endorsing Beall and Restall's pluralism. Shapiro's pluralism is rather different, and it is motivated largely by theories that Beall and Restall reject. One might think that Shapiro rejects GTT as a part of logical consequence, but he does not. GTT corresponds to one of the conceptions of consequence considered in chapter 2, so he accepts that GTT is part of the story of logical consequence, although less central than in Beall and Restall's view. Despite this divergence, we can see Shapiro building on Beall and Restall in the sense that the collection of logics on Shapiro's view includes the ones that Beall and Restall argue are ratified by GTT, although first-degree entailment may be included primarily in virtue of being a fragment of another relevant logic.

My first question is: what, if anything, does delimit logical consequence for Shapiro? To a certain extent, the question is, as Shapiro notes, terminological and relative to choice of vocabulary. It appears that almost all relations on appropriate relata are possible consequence relations, as long as they meet a few criteria, chief among which is giving rise to fruitful mathematical theories. The bounds of logical consequence are left open, since we do not know in advance what logics will yield fruitful mathematical theories. Shapiro's pluralism is, then, expansive. Indeed, Shapiro mentions many logics as promising candidates for acceptance by his pluralism. Omissions are unavoidable, but one logic, or family of logics, that deserves mention in connection with Shapiro's pluralism is fuzzy logic.[7] There are fruitful mathematical theories developed with fuzzy logic, so fuzzy logic naturally fits with Shapiro's view.

On Shapiro's view, there are many logics, and a natural question is what is philosophically significant about being a logic. Beall and Restall have an answer, one that appeals to truth-preservation via GTT, being normative, and being formal. Shapiro's answer is less clear. He accepts that, at least in some contexts, truth-preservation, formality, and normativity capture aspects of logical consequence. He also considers the view that logic is universally applicable. He rejects this view, although he allows that one can define a universally applicable logic, albeit one that has no special place in eclectic pluralism. Shapiro's response may be that the significance of being a logic varies with purpose and logic. Some logics provide norms for reasoning, some exhibit traditional sorts of formality, and others have yet other virtues. An eclectic pluralist may turn the question around to ask why one should expect there to be a unified answer to the question of significance, given the variety of logics.

For the next issue, I turn to Shapiro's criticism of Beall and Restall that says that construction stages, the kind of cases they use to ratify intuitionistic logic, do not respect the constructive spirit of intuitionism once one moves beyond pure logic. The criticism focuses on Heyting arithmetic. One can give models of Heyting arithmetic that are Kripke structures, familiar from possible worlds semantics for modal logic. In those models, all the standard natural numbers exist at each point, which means that those models do not sustain the intuitive picture of constructing the natural numbers in stages. Shapiro says, "Beall and Restall's arguments do not motivate the conclusion that the Kripke framework is an admissible instance of the GTT. At least not if intuitionistic mathematics is to be thereby sanctioned" (37, emphasis added).

This objection to Beall and Restall highlights an important feature of Shapiro's view. Beall and Restall are more concerned with logics than with other, contentful theories. Shapiro's concern, as has been noted, is with mathematical theories, particularly those using non-classical logics. Given this focus, however, one wonders whether Shapiro is not talking past some of the opposing views. He says, "The present, folk-relativism . . . will be judged ultimately on its overall merits, the extent to which it makes sense of the practice of pursuing and applying mathematics" (81). It is not clear that other logical pluralists accept this last desideratum, and logical monists will see little reason to do so.

The advocate of Beall and Restall's pluralism may have a response to Shapiro's criticism concerning Heyting arithmetic. She can say that GTT is used to ratify logics, and once a logic is ratified, it can be used in mathematical theories, which do not require further ratification from GTT. This response, however, requires saying something about the necessary truth of excluded middle. Shapiro rejects the universal validity of excluded middle, and the advocate of Beall and Restall's pluralism may be able to adapt this to her view.

A final point about Shapiro's view is worth noting. The role of the Hilbertian perspective in it cannot be overstated. It figures in the philosophical motivation for the view as well as the objections and responses to other logical pluralists and to logical monists. Given this importance, it is surprising that the Hilbertian perspective does not receive more philosophical discussion, at least with respect to its use in the philosophy of logic.

There is much to like in Shapiro's Varieties of Logic. It is an engaging contribution to the debates over logical pluralism that articulates an appealing pluralist position, and it highlights many fruitful connections between the philosophy of logic and other areas of philosophy. It will be required reading for anyone interested in logical pluralism or the philosophy of logic.


I am grateful to Rohan French, Ole Hjortland, Dave Ripley, and Stewart Shapiro for helpful feedback on this review. I would also like to thank Catarina Dutilh-Novaes and Leon Geerdink for useful discussion of sections of the book.


Bacon, A. (2013). Non-classical metatheory for non-classical logics. Journal of Philosophical Logic, 42(2): 335-355.

Beall, J. and Restall, G. (2006). Logical Pluralism. Oxford University Press.

Hájek, P. (2010). Fuzzy logic. In Zalta, E. N., editor, Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Fall 2010 Edition).

Humberstone, L. (2005). Logical discrimination. In Beziau, J.-Y., editor, Logica Universalis: Towards a General Theory of Logic, pages 207-228. Springer, Basel, 2nd edition.

McCarty, D. C. (1994). On theorems of Gödel and Kreisel: Completeness and Markov's principle. Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 35(1): 99-107.

Meyer, R. K. and Dunn, J. M. (1969). E, R, and γ. Journal of Symbolic Logic, 34(3):460-474.

Tennant, N. (2005). Relevance in reasoning. In Shapiro, S., editor, The Oxford Handbook of Philosophy of Mathematics and Logic, pages 696-726. Oxford University Press.

[1] More carefully, Church's Thesis is the schema, Ɐx∃!yA(x,y) ∃eⱯxy(T(e,x,y) & A(x, U(y))), where T(x, y, z) says z is a code of the complete computation for the Turing machine with code x on input y, U(x) is the output of the computation coded by x, and A does not contain e free.

[2] For discussion, see, for example Humberstone (2005).

[3] Although many meta-theoretic investigations use classical logic, some use non-classical logics, for example, McCarty (1994) or Bacon (2013).

[4] See, for example, Meyer and Dunn (1969).

[5] At least, to many relevant logicians. There are exceptions, such as Tennant (2005).

[6] They also have a modal aspect, although that will not feature in what I have to say.

[7] See Hájek (2010) for an overview.