Varieties of Religion Today: William James Revisited

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Taylor, Charles, Varieties of Religion Today: William James Revisited, Harvard University Press, 2002, 127pp, $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674007603.

Reviewed by Philip L. Quinn, University of Notre Dame


This slender volume derives from lectures Charles Taylor was invited to give at the Institute for Human Sciences in Vienna in the spring of 2000. It addresses the large question of the place of religion in our secular age. Taylor’s argument takes the form of a confrontation with the thought of William James that is focused on Varieties of Religious Experience and some of the essays in The Will to Believe. As Taylor notes in the preface, his engagement with James “is idiosyncratic and selective” (vi). His aim is to highlight ways in which James speaks to our present religious predicament.

The book is divided into four chapters. In the first, Taylor offers a sketch of the theme in Varieties that he regards as particularly relevant to the contemporary religious situation. It is the Jamesian view of religion as primarily “something that individuals experience” (4). There are two aspects of this view that deserve attention. One is its individualism: religion resides chiefly in the individual, not in corporate life. The other is its experientialism: the real locus of religion is in feeling and action, not in doctrinal formulations. Jamesian religion is a matter of inward personal devotion rather than outward conformity to norms of ritual or orthodoxy. Taylor suggests that this take on religion “is very much at home in modern culture” (9) and, indeed, “can seem entirely understandable, even axiomatic, to lots of people” (13). He locates its origins in Latin Christendom in the high Middle Ages. In outlining its subsequent historical development, he alludes to the Brethren of the Common Life, Francis de Sales, the Cambridge Platonists, George Fox, John Wesley, the Great Awakening, Pietism and Romanticism. And he mentions analogies with Hindu bhakti, Judaic Hassidism and Islamic Sufism. According to Taylor, however, the Jamesian perspective on religion is limited, and can be a source of distortion, in three ways. First, it neglects the collective connection prominent in some religions by which ecclesiastical life mediates between the religious object and the believer. Second, it also fails to appreciate the collective connection established by the sacramentality emphasized in Catholic traditions. And third, it excludes theology from the center of religious life. Yet despite this narrowness, Taylor contends, the Jamesian perspective provides a sharp vision of religious phenomena that are or should be of concern to us.

The book’s second chapter discusses two such phenomena. One is the plight of the twice-born or sick soul, which reaches a state of assurance that all will be well only after passing through “the three great negative experiences of melancholy, evil, and the sense of personal sin” (37). Taylor thinks that these three forms of spiritual anguish continue to haunt our world. Even if James’s readers, who are commonly educated nonbelievers, do not themselves feel a sense of personal sin, they will be aware of the rapid growth of evangelical Christianity, in which this sense is very acute, throughout the world, but particularly in Latin America and Africa. The horrors of the twentieth century have, of course, made evil an oppressive presence in the lives of reflective people. Indeed, as I see it, recent books such as Marilyn Adams’s Horrendous Evils and the Goodness of God and Claudia Card’s The Atrocity Paradigm testify eloquently that even academic philosophers feel impelled to respond to evils that threaten to render the lives of both victims and perpetrators meaningless. And melancholy, which Taylor construes as a sense of the loss of significance, remains a source of agony in the modern context. On his view, its distinctive shape now is “not the sense of rejection and exile from an unchallengeable cosmos of significance, but rather the intimation of what may be a definitive emptiness, the final dawning of the end of the last illusion of significance” (39-40). James thinks that the experience of the twice-born soul is deeper and more truly religious than the healthy-minded optimism of the once-born, and on this point Taylor is prepared to credit him with extraordinary insight into the spiritual hungers of modern culture.

The other phenomenon treated in the second chapter is James’s apologia pro fide sua in “The Will to Believe.” Taylor interprets his discussion of the ethics of belief as an inner debate in which James had to argue against voices “that held that religion was a thing of the past, that one could no longer in conscience believe in this kind of thing in an age of science” (43). According to James, when we are faced with the religious hypothesis, we confront a passional decision about whether it is best to yield to our fear of its being mistaken or to yield to our hope that it is true. Taylor portrays each of our options as deeply attractive. Supporting the choice to steer clear of the religious hypothesis is the thought that “it is wrong, uncourageous, unmanly, a kind of self-indulgent cheating, to have recourse to this kind of interpretation, which we know appeals to something in us, offers comfort, or meaning, and which we therefore should fend off, unless absolutely driven to them [sic] by the evidence, which is manifestly not the case” (54). Bertrand Russell and Sigmund Freud invoke considerations of this sort when they write, in a somewhat self-congratulatory style, of their own courage in living without religious comfort or illusions. Supporting the choice to adopt the religious hypothesis is a sense that its appeal to something in us hints “that there is something important here which we need to explore further, that this exploration can lead us to something of vital significance, which would otherwise remain closed to us” (55). James himself was decisively influenced by this kind of feeling. Taylor does not argue that one of these stances is superior to the other. The main point he wishes to make is that in our culture many people feel the pull of both positions even after they have opted for one of them. For believers, this can take the form of a fragilized faith, a sense that their view of God, for example, is too anthropocentric or too indulgent. For nonbelievers, it can take the form of understanding faith as a temptation to which others they respect give in, even though they succeed in resisting it. Taylor praises James for telling us more than anyone else about what it is like to stand on the cusp between these two great options, having little or nothing more to go on than the gut feeling that there may be something of tremendous importance at stake in one’s decision. In explicating what it is like “to stand in that open space and feel the winds pulling you now here, now there,” James “describes a crucial site of modernity and articulates the decisive drama enacted there” (59).

James is not a presence in the book’s third chapter. There Taylor sets forth his own account of the contemporary religious situation, using a genealogical method to show how it has grown out of previous religious dispensations in European history. Relying implicitly on a conceptual apparatus heavily indebted to the masters of twentieth-century sociological theory, he aspires to construct a grand narrative that will cast new light on the secularization of the public sphere. The story begins in the Middle Ages in an enchanted world. God’s presence in the world is reflected in the sorts of sacred places and times familiar to readers of Mircea Eliade’s The Sacred and the Profane, and the sacred king expresses the connection between the political order and the divine. When the Weberian disenchantment of the world occurs, sacred meanings are no longer expressed directly in the universe around us. But the natural world of Newtonian science still provides evidence of divine design, and a moral order designed by God remains normative for the social world. In this moral order, articulated by Locke and transmitted to us through Rousseau and Marx, human individuals are meant to associate in society for the sake of mutual service for mutual benefit. Disenchantment proceeds along two paths. In Catholic societies, social hierarchies remain in place but begin to acquire functional justifications in terms of their contributions to the divinely ordained moral order. Taylor thinks of this situation as the baroque compromise or the paleo-Durkheimian dispensation, observing dryly that the path out of it “went through a catastrophic revolutionary overturn” (71). The Protestant path or anglophone trajectory, as Taylor describes the alternative, is smoother and leads ultimately to the neo-Durkheimian dispensation most fully realized in the United States. In its denominational society, churches are affinity groups in which membership is entirely voluntary, and yet the society as a whole imagines itself to constitute a corporate religious body under providential moral norms ordained by God. Adopting Robert Bellah’s idea of an American civil religion, Taylor argues that belief is sustained by being identified with the state through civil religion, while at the same time differences in spiritual style are accommodated by denominational pluralism. On his view, it is not surprising that the neo-Durkheimian dispensation supports a high level of religious belief and practice in the United States.

Taylor is convinced that a profound alteration in the social conditions of religious belief has taken place in the past half-century. As he sees it, the consumer revolution and the rise of youth culture are external manifestations of this change. The spread of expressivist individualism and the culture of authenticity downward from an intellectual elite, which is a legacy of Romanticism, reflects this transformation at the level of cultural self-understanding. The world of fashion and its space of mutual display, already visible in some of Manet’s paintings and in Baudelaire’s fascination with the flâneur and the dandy, is another indication of this shift in our ways of being together in society. (And, I would add, Walter Benjamin’s vast, unfinished Arcades Project remains of interest to us chiefly because it hints at ways in which we might make the new social space of mutual display comprehensible to ourselves.) The upshot of this alteration in social conditions for religion is a post-Durkheimian dispensation in which “the spiritual dimension of existence is quite unhooked from the political” (76). In this new dispensation, the morality of mutual respect and toleration seems to be embedded in a free-standing ideal of authentic self-fulfillment, not inscribed in a divinely ordained moral order that justifies the enforcement of norms of sexual ethics or economic productivity. According to Taylor, “in the new expressivist dispensation, there is no necessary embedding of our link to the sacred in any particular broader framework, whether ‘church’ or state” (95). Religiously speaking, society now leaves each of us on our own, at liberty to do our own thing spiritually. For Taylor, this is the state of affairs brilliantly foreshadowed by the individualistic experientialism advocated by James.

Taylor is, of course, too shrewd to fall prey to the illusion that all, or almost all, contemporary believers are happy with his post-Durkheimian dispensation. He calls attention to the fact that “the Catholic church in the United States frequently lines up with the Christian right in attempts to reestablish earlier versions of the moral consensus that enjoyed in their day neo-Durkheimian religious grounding” (98). However, he judges that the embattled nature of these attempts shows how we have slid out of the old dispensation. In support of this judgment, he appeals to José Casanova’s Public Religions in the Modern World, which characterizes such interventions in political life as aimed at a “deprivatization” of religion. Taylor insists that “the situation in which these interventions take place is defined by the end of a uniform Durkheimian dispensation, and the growing acceptance among many people of a post-Durkheimian understanding” (124). He endorses the view that the postwar shift in social conditions has increasingly destabilized and undermined the various Durkheimian dispensations.

In the book’s brief final chapter, Taylor briskly covers three points on which James has missed something important about our new religious predicament. The first is the extent to which many people still find their spiritual homes in the collective connections of churches, even though their religious loyalties are unhooked from the sacralized societies of paleo-Durkheimian order and the national civil religions of neo-Durkheimian order. The second point is the continuing importance of religious markers of ethnic or historical identity in societies forced to defend their integrity against external oppression. Taylor cites the Poles and Irish as examples of this phenomenon, but he also notes that we find cynical manipulation of such religious markers in Milosevic’s Serbia and by India’s BJP. And the third point is the way in which many people respond to religious experience by searching for exacting spiritual disciplines of meditation or prayer. They are not content with the many “touchy-feely” spiritualities on offer in our culture. As Taylor puts the point, “many people are not satisfied with a momentary sense of wow” (116)!

Taylor aims to be, for the most part, descriptive rather than evaluative in his treatment of our present religious situation. He does not hide the fact that he is a believer, but he worries about whether his judgment is biased by his religious stance. At one point he remarks that a conclusion he has reached “may be a bit of believers’ chauvinism that I am adding to the equation” (60). Yet it seems to me that he does aspire to reconcile believers to the post-Durkheimian dispensation. In the concluding chapter, after acknowledging the tendency of individualized religious experience to slide toward the feel-good and the superficial, he tells conservative souls who wish to condemn the present age for that reason to ask themselves whether it is even conceivable to turn back the clock to either of the Durkheimian dispensations. And he somewhat sternly reminds them not to forget “the spiritual costs of various kinds of forced conformity: hypocrisy, spiritual stultification, inner revolt against the Gospel, the confusion of faith and power, and even worse” (114). It is no doubt fitting that such a project of reconciliation should be undertaken by a distinguished Hegel scholar. I am skeptical about the project’s prospects for success. But maybe conservative souls can be persuaded to find some comfort in the thought that religious energies have not disappeared under the post-Durkheimian dispensation, even though they now manifest themselves in new and sometimes unattractive guises.

The book’s style is simple and direct, and it is a pleasure to read. However, I doubt that many academic students of religion will find it satisfying. Philosophers of religion are likely to complain that Taylor fails to engage with recent discussions of the epistemology of religious experience or of pragmatic arguments for the rationality of religious belief that use James’s thought as a source. Taylor may intend to defuse criticism of this kind by remarking on “the unfortunate fact that James is neglected by contemporary academic philosophers, with a few honorable exceptions” (22). But he does not tell us who the honorable exceptions are, and he does not consider their views. Similarly, historians of religion are apt to complain that his grand narrative is too sketchy and impressionistic, and not richly textured or developed enough, to explain why or even how changes in religious dispensation occurred. Nor is it firmly grounded in the sort of detailed empirical evidence that is typical of good historical scholarship. To be sure, Taylor reminds the reader more than once that his dispensations are ideal types, but he does not argue that these particular ideal types have the power to contribute to explanations of historical change. And sociologists of religion may well complain that he fails to pay enough attention to the developments in sociological theory that have taken place since the days of the masters such as Weber and Durkheim, whose concepts he employs without much critical scrutiny. Thus, for example, though he does make contact with the work of Bellah and Casanova, he does not come to grips with recent challenges to secularization theory found in the writings of Christian Smith or Rodney Stark and their associates. I find some merit in such complaints. I do not think we should look to this book for important contributions to the philosophy, history or sociology of religion.

We should instead look to it for scattered insights, if we wish to read it with profit. I think it contains quite a few observations that are worth pondering, even though I am inclined to quarrel with some of them. An example is Taylor’s claim that the Jamesian passional decision for or against the religious hypothesis is a crucial site of modernity. Let me conclude with some reflections on another example.

During the past decade or so, several American liberal political theorists have argued for restrictions on the use of religious reasons in the public square. Robert Audi is an especially striking instance of this phenomenon. In his recent Religious Commitment and Secular Reason, he contends that the ethics of citizenship for a liberal democracy contains prima facie obligations not to advocate or support laws or public policies that restrict human conduct unless one has, is willing to offer and is sufficiently motivated by adequate secular reasons for such advocacy or support. It has for quite a while seemed to me rather odd to find liberal theorists making a big fuss about religious reasons in politics at a time when religion has been steadily losing influence in American public life, becoming ever more marginalized and privatized. Perhaps Taylor’s conceptions of neo-Durkheimian and post-Durkheimian dispensations can help us to make sense of this situation. If you believe, with Taylor and Casanova, that we now live under something like a post-Durkheimian dispensation, you will find it natural to view interventions in politics by the Catholic church and the Christian right as an attempt to deprivatize religion and a challenge to the status quo. And if you are more or less content with a post-Durkheimian order and regard such a challenge as a threat to it, you might well, like Audi, think it urgent to respond by insisting on secularist principles of political morality. Of course, this interpretation of our situation can be contested. From the perspective of many members of the Catholic church and the Christian right, it probably seems that we still live under a neo-Durkheimian dispensation, albeit an embattled dispensation, subject to severe pressures toward secularization and the privatization of religion. Thus understood, our situation is one in which the proposals of liberal theorists such as Audi pose a threat to the status quo, because they would, if accepted, push us further in the direction of an unattractive post-Durkheimian order. I do not think it would be easy to determine which of these points of view is closer to being correct. The point I wish to make by setting them forth is rather that Taylor’s conceptual framework seems to provide an insightful way of articulating them and so may turn out to be of assistance when we try to understand the social context of current debates about religious arguments in the public square.

I recommend this book to those who are willing to mine it for insights that may prove to be fruitful upon further reflection. I suspect, however, that it will frustrate the expectations of those who come to it looking for a substantial contribution to the philosophy, history or sociology of religion.