Veritas: The Correspondence Theory and Its Critics

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Gerald Vision, Veritas: The Correspondence Theory and Its Critics, The MIT Press, 2004, 320pp, $36.00 (hbk), ISBN 0262220709.

Reviewed by Marian David, University of Notre Dame


Early in the 20th century, Russell and Moore maintained that a belief is true iff it corresponds with a fact, false iff it doesn't. This theory of truth is but one member of a large family whose various members invoke various relations, relating truthbearers of various sorts to worldly items of various ontological categories. In view of this multiplicity of versions of "the" correspondence theory, one might think the first item on the agenda should be to zoom in on one specific version and lay it out in some detail. But that, according to Vision, is not such a good idea. He points out that the main action in debates about correspondence is not about this or that specific version but about the viability of the correspondence project as a whole. If we tie our hands at the outset to one specific version, we will get enmeshed in debating the pros and cons of that particular formulation, losing sight of the more basic issues and the bigger picture. Not surprisingly, then, most of Vision's book is a general discussion and defense of the bigger correspondence picture. He conducts the discussion in informal terms and uses various alternative "broad characterizations" of correspondence-type theories, driving home the point that he does not want us to get hung up on the specifics of any one formulation.

Vision's Broad Characterizations

I begin with a general criticism. There is a confusion in Vision's use of the terms he favors when characterizing the basic outlines of the correspondence picture. The problem arises right at the start and reoccurs at a number of places in the book. Consider some of his broad characterizations:

[A] The truth of a proposition is constituted by a state of the world such that, were the proposition stated, it would state the world to be that way. (pp. 1, 47, 87)

[B] Its import is that the truth of a proposition consists in its satisfying a relation (correspondence?) to a state of the world, the latter often identified as a "fact" … the reality that constitutes truth (= the truthmaker) … (p. 4)

[C] Correspondence then can be stated as the view that what makes a proposition true, or constitutes its truth, is a particular (more or less general) worldly circumstance to which the content of the proposition is related. (p. 12)

[D] … we say that truth is constituted by the relation of a proposition to a state of the world. (p. 53)

Looking at [A], Vision's "quasi-official statement" of the correspondence view, one might worry about the dubious idea that propositions can not only be stated but can themselves state things (propositions?). But let's set that aside. What I am worried about is this. According to [A], the truth of a proposition is constituted by a certain state of the world, namely one the proposition is related to in the right way. This is odd. By my lights, a correspondence account of truth says instead that the truth of a proposition is constituted by the proposition's standing in the right relation to some state of the world. Say John is married only to Jane. Now compare [A] with: "John's being a husband is constituted by a woman he is married to, i.e. by Jane". Surely not. John's being a husband is constituted by his being married to some woman or other. The first part of [B] gets things right: the truth of a proposition consists in its corresponding with some fact. But then, at the end of [B] and in [C], Vision says again that it is the corresponding fact itself, the truthmaker, which constitutes truth -- and in [D] he says that truth is constituted by the relation a proposition has to a state of the world. At first I thought Vision might be using the operative terms ("constitutes", "consists", "makes true") in importantly different ways which might clear up the confusion. But no, for he says: "I draw no distinction between a proposition's truth being constituted by X and consisting in X. X's making a proposition true is just the converse of a proposition's truth being constituted by X" (p. 53).

A typical correspondence theory holds that the property of being true is a general relational property, i.e. "x is true" picks out a property of the form (y)(xRy). Vision seems to be confusing this with a singular relational property, xRb, or worse, with the relatum, b, that is related to x by R, and even with the relation R itself.

Partly responsible for this confusion might be an ambiguity in the notion of truthmaking which, going unnoticed, has infected Vision's use of "consists in" and "is constituted by". Take a view according to which x is true iff x stands in R to some fact. One can say that (i) x is made true by x's standing in R to some fact. One can also say that (ii) x is made true by a fact that stands in R to x. Both uses of "is made true by" are all right. But they ought to be distinguished. They pick out two quite different relations: the one in (i) is really just property instantiation; the one in (ii) is a relation peculiar to truth.

It is noteworthy in this context that Vision never really distinguishes between two sorts of correspondence formulations. The first are intended to answer the question "What is truth?" and take the form of a definition: truth is a general relational property, e.g. the property of corresponding to some fact or other. Formulations of the second sort don't take the form of an answer to the question "What is truth?". Instead, they offer a general principle or axiom governing truth, the truthmaker principle: A true proposition is made true by something in the world (this involves the second of the two uses of "is made true by" distinguished above). These two sorts of formulations strike me as importantly different. I wish Vision had been much more explicit about the difference between them.

The only alternative I can see to my confusion-interpretation of Vision's broad characterizations is this. When Vision talks about "the truth of a proposition" in [A], [C], and [D], he does not mean to be talking about the property of being true but instead about the whole state of affairs of a certain proposition's being true. If so, he is telling us in [A] and [C] that that state of affairs is constituted by the relevant proposition plus the corresponding fact, and in [D] that it is constituted by the proposition plus the correspondence relation. Putting these together we could take him to mean that the state of affairs is constituted by the relevant proposition, plus the correspondence relation, plus a fact that stands in the correspondence relation to the proposition. Note that, on this view, the general relational property of corresponding to some fact or other, i.e. the property of being true, does not show up in the state of affairs of a proposition's being true. That's rather puzzling. Maybe it's ultimately defensible -- I don't know. In any case, if something like this is Vision's view, I would have expected him to say so.

Non-Negotiable Intuitions

"Correspondence", Vision says, "has an undeniably primal attraction, absent in its competitors" (p. 32). He identifies two "non-negotiable intuitions" about truth. Taken together, they are supposed to account for a good part of correspondence's primal attraction. They are also, I think, intended to pin down a bit what the various members of the correspondence family have in common.

One of Vision's non-negotiable intuitions is Cognition-Independence: "Nothing in the account of truth itself indicates that truth is, ever will be, or can be entertained by minds of roughly our capacity" (p. 38). Vision argues that coherentist, pragmatist, and other anti-realist accounts of truth run afoul of this intuition while correspondence theories conform to it. Note, Vision is not saying here that correspondence theories entail metaphysical realism. That would be a mistake. One could consistently supplement the Russell-Moore version, for example, with the thesis that all facts are mind or cognition-dependent (of course, Russell and Moore didn't do this; but McTaggart did: he was an idealist correspondence theorist). The point that correspondence theories are not automatically committed to metaphysical realism has been made before -- among others by Vision in his earlier book Modern Anti-Realism and Manufactured Truth (Routledge 1988) -- but it probably bears repeating. Cognition-Independence is formulated in recognition of this point: it is not that correspondence theories are committed to the falsehood of anti-realism, it is rather that they don't take on board any anti-realist commitments.

Vision's other non-negotiable intuition is Variability: "The truth-value of a proposition would be altered were the world to change in certain definite ways, or, if the truth-value must remain the same, it is because the world cannot change in relevant ways" (p. 33). This suggests that propositions might actually alter their truth-value with changes in worldly circumstances -- a suggestion that many, including many correspondence theorists, will resist, maintaining that propositions have their truth-values eternally or timelessly. However, the problem here seems to lie primarily in the wording. Vision's other remarks about Variability make fairly clear that he usually thinks of it in terms of counterfactuals which don't commit him to propositions' actually altering their truth-values -- roughly: if the world had been different in such and such ways, then this or that proposition would have had a different truth-value. Still, I am not quite happy with Vision's handling of Variability. Throughout the book, he emphasizes as a crucial feature of correspondence theories that the world is in the driver's seat when it comes to truth and falsehood: truth-values are determined by worldly circumstances. Though he doesn't say it explicitly, he talks as if Variability somehow underwrites this crucial asymmetrical feature. It does not. The relevant counterfactuals, hence Variability, can be turned around. Yes: if the worldly circumstance that snow is white had not obtained, then the proposition that snow is white would not have been true. But also: if the proposition that snow is white had not been true, then the worldly circumstance that snow is white would not have obtained. Variability by itself does not support the idea that a proposition has the truth-value it has because of the way the world is.


The third chapter contains, among other things, an interesting defense of facts. Vision himself doesn't think correspondence theorists have to appeal to facts. Nevertheless, he still wants to defend them, because many opponents cite their rejection of facts as the main reason for their rejection of correspondence theories. So he asks (p. 62): "Why are facts as truthmakers so widely abhorred?"

Vision isn't at all impressed by worries about individuation conditions for facts: "We appear perfectly capable of providing clear and uncontroversial examples" (p. 61), including clear examples of different facts. Admittedly, there are examples where things get murky once questions about identity conditions are pressed. But the same holds for hosts of other objects and phenomena that the foes of facts are happy to take on board (including, one might point out, truthbearers). Worries about identity conditions will not explain why facts are so frequently singled out as being especially problematic.

The most common charge against facts is that they are merely true statements in disguise, hence not fit to serve as truthmakers of statements (Strawson and many others). The charge is based on the observation that facts, like statements, are specified by that-clauses, combined with the claim that fact talk is equivalent to, or paraphrasable in terms of, true-statement talk. Vision responds that the claimed equivalence or paraphrasability doesn't really hold (he cites causal and explanatory contexts as counterevidence). More importantly, even if it held, it wouldn't show what the critics take it to show, because the convergence of the two idioms might be explained in two ways: (a) Facts are merely reifications of a way of speaking, i.e. of truth talk; or alternatively (b) "Since it is a, perhaps the, chief job of statements to state facts, it is understandable that the same linguistic resources would be marshaled to formulate both" (p. 66). Opponents of facts as truthmakers rashly embrace the first explanation without having eliminated the second. Vision observes, by way of comparison, that we use the words "violets on a mahogany table" to talk about violets on a mahogany table and to talk about the mirror image of violets on a mahogany table; but we're not inclined to infer that the mirror image doesn't differ from the violets (cf. p. 67). The point seems well taken. Moreover, it is an instance of a more general phenomenon. Having observed a structural similarity between a mode of speech and some ontological category, some philosophers are quick to infer that the ontological category is an illusion -- a matter of us "projecting" the structure of our language onto reality -- without even considering the alternative hypothesis that the relevant linguistic structure might, on the contrary, reflect a genuine ontological category.

Brief Statements of Correspondence

Many formulations of correspondence theories are very brief, little more than one-liners. Vision defends the explanatory value of such brief, "epigrammatic" statements. (He cites, with approval, correspondence epigrams from Plato, Aristotle, Aquinas, Tarski, and a good number of contemporary authors.) His defense is somewhat distributed: much of it is contained in the fourth chapter of the book, but large parts of it show up in other chapters as well.

Some complain that correspondence epigrams cannot count as explanations of truth because they lack detail. Vision responds that in philosophy demand for detail tends to be a distraction. He doubts that philosophical illumination is truly advanced by working out the details of a proposal: going into details is usually fruitless as long as basic problems remain and not really urgent once the basic problems are resolved (cf. p. xiii). He also points out that "it is never made reasonably clear just how much detail will satisfy critics" (p. 24) and wonders why brevity should keep a formulation from being explanatory (cf. p. 25). Vision is not opposed to working out the details. His point is that he finds no good reason for thinking that lack of detail must count as a serious defect in a view.

Presently more prominent is the Platitude Strategy (associated with, e.g., Blackburn, Davidson, and Crispin Wright). It tries to disarm typical correspondence formulations, such as "truth is correspondence with fact", by maintaining that they are mere platitudes acceptable to anyone; that they are so trivial as to be compatible with any theory of truth: "they don't so much as show up on the theorist's radar screen" (p. 32). Vision observes that this strategy has a hard time distinguishing alleged correspondence platitudes from brief summaries of the gist of a substantive correspondence theory: Does the Platitude Strategist maintain that the gist of a substantive correspondence theory cannot be put in a nutshell? Why would that be? (This, and quite a bit more, comes up during an extended discussion in chapter 4 of Crispin Wright's recent views.) Vision also remarks on a related move made popular by William James. James said he accepted, as a matter of course (as platitudinous), that truth is agreement with reality. Then he went on to claim that "agreement with reality" means leading to satisfactory experience. Vision observes that there is a time-honored tradition of reinterpreting philosophical claims at will. But "things cannot be quite so facile" (p. 91): that a statement can be reinterpreted to say something different doesn't show that it does not say what it says.

Responding to the Platitude Strategist's claim that brief correspondence formulations are vacuous, Vision asks, apparently rhetorically: "How could something that conflicts with coherence, pragmatism, deflationism, pluralism, nihilism, and any of the other well-defined, explicitly anti-correspondence views in the literature be vacuous?" (p. 22) This occurs early on in the book, and I am not sure how it fits with what comes later. After all, in his discussion of Cognition-Independence (see above) Vision will be at pains to point out that correspondence theories are compatible with anti-realist theories of truth. In what sense, then, can it be said that correspondence theories "conflict" with coherentist and pragmatist theories of truth? Sure enough, Vision holds that the latter do not conform to the criterion of Cognition-Independence. But that would seem to be a different matter: the criterion of Cognition-Independence is not a correspondence theory of truth.


In chapter 8, Vision presents his preferred version of a correspondence theory, a noteworthy development of a well-known proposal by J. L. Austin. Chapters 5 and 6, together with some other parts of the book, present Vision's critique of deflationary accounts of truth.

I am a bit of two minds about this book. On the one hand, I found it difficult at times to figure out how the argument was supposed to go. The confusion in Vision's use of his basic vocabulary (described earlier in this review), which surfaces at various important places in the book, doesn't help either -- I am afraid that some, though by no means all, of his objections to deflationism about truth are enmeshed in this confusion. On the other hand, the book contains a large number of interesting ideas and arguments; not the least of which are some of his objections to deflationism, which advocates of this approach should definitely check out. Moreover, Vision has a refreshingly different perspective on many of the standard debating points. I recommend his book to those who already know their way around a bit in the field and are looking for fresh ideas about familiar questions.