Vico: The First New Science

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Pompa, Leon (ed. and trans.), Vico: The First New Science, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 366pp, $23.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521387264.

Reviewed by Robert Miner, Baylor University


Composed in 1725 but never before published in a full-length English edition, The First New Science is Leon Pompa’s translation of the first version of the master work that Vico wrote and rewrote until his death in 1744. Understandably, the editors of the series in which this serviceable translation appears (Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought) decided not to go with the text’s full title. Principles of a New Science Concerning the Nature of the Nations, Through Which the Principles of a New System of the Natural Law of the Gentes are Retrieved does not fit very well on a book’s front cover.

A small number of Vico connoisseurs have persistently claimed that the 1725 version of the Scienza nuova— dubbed the Scienza nuova prima by Vico himself in his Autobiography—is a more readable text, and a more illuminating guide to its author’s intentions, than the better known 1744 edition. Some who have made this claim also allege that Vico wrote the final Scienza nuova when he was senile—although it might be remembered that at least one of his contemporaries claimed that Vico was mad as far back as 1720. These speculations aside, the suggestion that the 1725 Scienza nuova is a less cluttered text than either the 1730 or 1744 versions is not implausible. The Scienza nuova prima is divided into five books. Book 1, “The Necessity of the End and the Difficulty of the Means of Retrieving a New Science,” begins with a relatively clear statement of the problem. Neither philosophers nor philologists have adequately discerned the origins of human culture. Books 2 and 3 perform the work of retrieval, unearthing respectively the “Principles of This Science Through Ideas” and the “Principles of This Science From the Side of Languages.” Book 4 provides the “Ground of the Proofs Which Establish This Science,” and Book 5 narrates the “Development of the Matter Whence a Philosophy of Humanity and a Universal History of the Nations are Formed at the Same Time.” The titles may be cumbersome, but they are relatively descriptive. Vico’s decision to provide each Book with its own Latin motto (taken from Virgil, the poets, the Latin heralds, the philosophers, and the historians) adds a touch of elegance, and even clarity.

Long before it became fashionable, Vico relentlessly criticized philosophers who suppose rational discourse to owe little or nothing to the pre-rational discourses of myth, law, and poetry. In our own time, some philosophers schooled in the Anglo-American tradition of the last century have grown skeptical about the value of “pure” conceptual analysis divorced from historical reality. One notable example of this phenomenon is Bernard Williams. Williams characterizes the approach of Nietzsche, which he increasingly finds congenial, as one that “typically combines, in a way that analytical philosophy finds embarrassing, history, phenomenology, ‘realistic’ psychology, and conceptual interpretation” (Williams, Making Sense of Humanity, pp. 75-6). Something similar is true of Vico. Anti-historical philosophy and anti-philosophical philology have both failed, Vico announces in the First New Science, because “we have hitherto lacked a science that is both a history and philosophy of humanity” (p. 18, §23). Vico may be regarded as the father of all modern attempts, from Williams and Alasdair MacIntyre to Collingwood and Hegel, to effect a rapprochement between history and philosophy. He is also the ancestor of contemporary attempts to recover a positive conception of rhetoric against the strictures of ‘method,’ as the opening pages of Gadamer’s Truth and Method, which explicitly invoke Vico, would suggest.

It would not be impossible for an Anglophone reader to draw these conclusions by reading The New Science of Giambattista Vico, the generally excellent and widely available translation of the 1744 Scienza nuova by Thomas Goddard Bergin and Max Fisch. Such a reader would also be well served by David Marsh’s recent translation of the same text. But her task will be made considerably easier by the availability of an English edition of the 1725 version. As such, both Pompa and the editors of the Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought are to be commended.

There are some flaws of the translation that a second edition will want to correct. Pompa mistranslates the titles of Book 2 and Book 3. In Italian, the title of Book 2 is “princìpi di questa Scienza per l’idee.” To render this as “principles of this Science concerning ideas” is a blunder. Vico is perfectly capable of using su or intorno when he wishes to. In this instance, he deliberately uses the preposition “per” because his aim is to derive principles for his science through an investigation of ideas, “per l’idee.” This is rather different from an attempt to furnish principles “concerning” a particular domain. Similarly, Pompa’s translation of the title of Book 3 is misleading. Vico’s title is not “principles of this Science concerning language,” but “princìpi di questa Scienza per la parte delle lingue.” An exact rendering of this phrase into idiomatic English is not possible, but a more faithful translation would be “principles of this Science from the side of languages.” In addition to preserving Vico’s use of the plural (le lingue, “languages”), such a rendering better captures Vico’s intention to draw principles for his Science from a study of languages, rather than to treat “language” as a quasi-autonomous subject matter, as Pompa’s version would suggest. The appearance of maladroit translations in running headers that occur on each page of the work’s two longest parts is annoying.

In his Glossary, Pompa makes the argument that Vico’s use of cose, “things,” should only infrequently, if at all, be translated as “institutions.” Pompa’s argument is sound: the translation of cose ought “to avoid the suggestion of things that are instituted, i.e. deliberately set up, since Vico believes that many things that become institutions arise naturally and without deliberate intention” (p. lxiv). How strange, then, that Pompa should render “le umane cose delle nozze” as “the human institution of marriage” (p. 172, §294), and elsewhere translate “cose civili” as “civil institutions” (see, e.g., p. 288, §521). A term not included in the Glossary, but which might have been, is ritruovare (Vico’s archaic spelling of ritrovare.) Pompa indiscriminately renders both ritruovare and scoprire as “to discover.” The former term should be translated “to retrieve” or “to recover.” Losing the archaelogical tone of ritruovare with no corresponding benefit makes little sense. “To discover” and “discovery” should be reserved for those places where Vico uses “scoprire” and “scoverta” (or, less frequently, “discoverta”).

Other candidates for correction in a future edition: intelligere does not mean “perceive by the senses” (p. 185, §316). Spons, spontis is not quite the same as “one’s self” (p. 209, §369—this is precisely the sort of anachronism that Vico would protest). To have Vico speak of “a kind of genera” (p. 205, §360) is to make him ungrammatical. Although careless at times in other ways, Vico does not make these sorts of mistakes. Nor would he conclude his description of the slide of fallen man into bestiality with the declaration “thus the giants become true” (p. 71, §102). A translation that is equally literal, and yet makes sense, would be “thus they become true giants.” Some overtranslations need to be scaled down. “Credutiche essi stessi si finsero” is rendered more appropriately as “beliefs … which they themselves feigned,” rather than Pompa’s “products of their own imagination” (p. 78, §116). (Finsero as “feigned” has the additional virtue of not obscuring the continuity with Hobbes’s usage of “to feign.”) “Against a stranger the right of possession is eternal”(p. 167, §284) overtranslates the phrase that Vico quotes from the Law of the XII Tables, “aeterna auctoritas [erat],” even if one supposes that it conveys the actual meaning of the last fragment of Table III. In other places, Pompa undertranslates. For example, “what his words say shall be law” is much too pale for “uti lingua nuncupassit, ita ius esto” (p. 122, §202; p. 201, §355). Aside from its loss of the uti … ita construction, Pompa’s rendering obscures that a nuncupatio is not just any utterance. It is a public proclamation or vow.

The First New Science does not meet the highest standards of philological accuracy. This is perhaps surprising in a work published by Cambridge University Press and which appears in a series that has Quentin Skinner for a co-editor. Some doubts arise about the reliability of the transcription of Greek terms, as when Pompa (or the editors) misprint phúle for phule/ (p. 90, §145). In some cases, however, the First New Science improves upon Battistini’s edition, e.g. the correction of cheruches to kerukes (p. 88, §140), the form that one finds at Iliad 18.503, 18.505, and 18.558. Sometimes Pompa will fail to convert Latin terms to the nominative case. On page 162 (§278) Pompa has Vico speak of “withe, which was called vimina in Latin, from vi.” In the original, Vico moves seamlessly from Italian into Latin (“a vi”), but an acceptable English translation must convert the ablative into a nominative (“from vis”). Similarly, Vico’s freedom to quote Varro in the accusative case does not license us to speak of the “formulam naturae” (p. 150, §251).

The editorial apparatus is far from useless, but it lacks the consistently high quality of Battistini’s annotations. It is strange to be told in a footnote that the source of Vico’s comments on Agamemnon and Iphigeneia is Lucretius (p. 84). The absence of any reference to Euripides is jarring. Occasionally Pompa will include the overly intrusive footnote, in spite of his declared intention to adopt “an agnostic attitude because of the degree of disagreement that exists in relation to the interpretation of almost any aspect of Vico’s thought” (p. xlviii). His own Introduction is an attempt to resolve some of these disagreements. It is unlikely either to persuade the Vico scholar or to help the beginner. The bibliography included by Pompa is long, but of doubtful value to its audience. It includes a large body of work in Italian that many readers who require Pompa’s translation will not be able to consult. Moreover, it fails to acknowledge some important work on Vico produced in the last decade. There is no mention of either Giuseppe Mazzotta or John Milbank. Both have done specialized research on Vico, and both are known beyond the somewhat narrow circles of Vico studies. Surely this would commend their work for inclusion in a bibliography designed to help the general reader. Perhaps most curious of all, in view of Pompa’s own emphasis on the mathematical and scientific context, is the omission of any reference to David Lachterman’s insightful work on Vico, nominalism and synthetic geometry.

Fortunately, these errors and oversights are easily correctible. Any first translation of a work is bound to have its share of mistakes. In view of the difficulty of our author’s prose, it is reasonable to suppose that Pompa’s effort contains fewer errors than one might expect from an initial translation of a work by Vico. Along with the editors of the Cambridge Texts in the History of Political Thought, Pompa is to be commended for making the first version of Vico’s magnum opus available in English.