Victims and Victimhood

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Trudy Govier, Victims and Victimhood, Broadview, 2015, 232pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781554810994.

Reviewed by Gary Watson, University of Southern California


The project of this book is to bring the ideas of victim and victimhood into the philosophical foreground. Certain cognate notions, such as those of wrong-doer, responsibility, and forgiveness, are subjects of vast literatures. In contrast, the notions of the title have themselves remained in the periphery, as though they were of little interest or well enough understood. Trudy Govier's sense is that there is "much to be gained" by bringing to light, and to philosophical scrutiny, the definitional, moral, and public policy issues that arise from discourse on victims and victimhood. The chapters range eclectically from the problems of allowing victims their voices and properly hearing what they have to say (Chapters 4-7), to the hazards of cultivating "victim-identities," to the determination of what we owe to victims by way of respect, restitution, restorative justice, vindication of their dignity, and the need for "closure" (Chapters 8-10).

Some of these issues emerge from initial consideration of the definition of a victim as "an innocent person harmed, through no fault of his own, by an external force or the wrongful act of another" (19). The first thing that emerges here is a set of questions about victims' agency and responsibility. (Note by the way that if 'innocent' means innocent of fault for the harm in question, then it is redundant in this definition.) As Govier emphasizes, here is one reason why categorizing victims is so contested. Warring factions cannot easily come to regard their enemies as victims. If I harm others in justified self-defense, or justified punishment, they cannot be said to be victims of my actions since I do them no wrong. Even when the parties are ready to concede this status to the opponent, they may claim the others to be victims to a lesser degree because the others bear more responsibility and fault for the harms in question. (This familiar dynamic is visible in the Northern Ireland troubles discussed in Chapter 2.)

A second source of contention has to do with the many cases in which victims choose to incur some risk of the harm or wrong in question, for example victims of eruptions who knowingly live near active volcanos, contemporary American football players who suffer permanent brain injury from concussions, and those who deliberately frequent crime-ridden areas of the city. The extent to which we are willing to speak of victims here depends on judgments regarding the degree and gravity of the risks and the extent to which agents have reasonable (relatively cost-free) opportunities to avoid them.

Thirdly, contrary to the above definition, arguably individuals can be wronged and therefore victimized without being harmed -- unless the wrong itself is the harm. I can be a victim of your stalking or more clearly of your trespass even if you do me no independently definable harm. Tort law recognizes plaintiffs who receive surgical procedures that demonstrably improve their health, but if the operations were without the patients' consent, they are nevertheless legally wronged and may sue for damages. Consider the tort case of beneficial battery. (Here see Mohr v. Williams (104 N.W.12 (Minn. 1905)). Thanks to Gregory Keating for this citation.)

There are also normative and conceptual questions about how far the net of victimhood can be cast. When the question is who has a legitimate complaint or a claim to support in virtue of some misfortune or wrongdoing, the net is inclusive. Virtually every Norwegian, except for the murderer himself, was a victim of Anders Brevik's massacre of scores of people in Oslo in 2011. In many contexts, though, that designation has to be much more restrictive. If we are deciding who to compensate (as in the September 11th memorial compensation fund, established by the US Congress in 2001) or whose name to add to a memorial (for example, in the United States Holocaust Memorial Museum), we have to get specific. These inevitably controversial decisions about who to exclude as victims must be settled in light of the purposes of the designation and of the available resources. Most radically, how can a third generation descendant of slaves have been harmed or wronged by what happened way back when? It is virtually certain that without slavery this particular individual would not even have existed. How can he be said to have been harmed or wronged by what gave him life? (Govier doesn't discuss the context of torts as a rich source of thinking about victimization or consider the so-called identity problem, raised by Derek Parfit.)

Finally, the definition's disjunction between harm caused by wrongdoing and harm caused by natural forces is complicated by the fact that those forces often do their evil work through human neglect. Consider the failure of civil society to protect the residents of New Orleans against Hurricane Katrina.

Govier's discussion of the various issues listed above is invariably clear, careful, and sensible. But her judgment about what questions merit discussion is often questionable. For example, Chapter 1 is organized as a discussion of "four common attitudes to victims":

Silence: Victims should be quiet; if they speak out about their suffering, they will be alarming and depressing to others.

Blame: To a considerable extent, victims are to blame for their own situation.

Deference: Victims should be honored and respected.

Agency: Victims are agents and as such share responsibility for the responses to wrongdoing, ill fortune, and disease. (1)

This is an unpromising start. The first two "attitudes" are simply preposterous. In particular cases, victims might have good practical and principled reasons for keeping silent, but no reasonable reader with experience of human affairs could deny that as "a general rule, silence about suffering and wrongdoing is not to be recommended" (5) or that "Blaming the victim often involves making unwarranted attributions of actions and intentions to persons already suffering from the effects of disaster, disease, or wrongdoing, thus raising ethical objections as well as cognitive ones" (9). While there is some truth in Deference, which Govier takes pains to articulate, that attitude too obviously requires significant qualification (more on this later.)

The attitude expressed by Agency is surely defensible, however (at least as restricted to the sub-category of victims with the capacity for responsible agency), and Govier effectively presses this theme of victims as agents in several places. Consider those whose victimhood becomes central to their self-conception or "identity." Such self-conceptions are in various ways deplorable. To dwell on (or in) one's misfortune or mistreatment may be self-indulgent and block one's possibilities for recovery. One may in fact come to need to be seen by others as someone who needs special sympathy and consideration. But as Govier emphasizes, there are more constructive ways in which one's having been a victim can figure essentially in what one's life is about. Those who have fallen prey to cancer or sexual assault might admirably dedicate themselves to helping those in a similar plight. In these cases, though, the operative identities crucially include a conception of oneself not merely as a passive victim but as someone with the capacity to respond to one's suffering in affirmative ways. Here is where agency comes in. Govier sensibly concludes that

a victim should seek to accept and develop her own abilities and, within reasonable bounds, accept responsibility for her own life. The victim who achieves responsible agency will do her best to resist any role or identity as a victim and develop her own capabilities on the basis of personal creative deliberations about what she can do and could learn to do (199-200).

In the middle chapters (4-7), Govier turns to a set of topics related to giving credence to the experience and testimony of victims. According to the "deference argument," because "only the victim of a wrong or harm knows what it is to experience that wrong or harm, there is an important kind of authority that rests with the victim." The authority in question is supposed to be normative: "the victim of a harm is the person in the best position to determine what is the appropriate response to it" (68). Govier rightly takes this to be a weak argument.

Victims' unique awareness of their suffering and special metaphysical access to it does not suffice to make them experts on matters pertaining to criminal trials, the justice of punishment, sentencing issues, peace processes, transitional justice, reparations . . . or even, for that matter, issues of their own treatment in the wake of serious harm (80).

But I am doubtful of her judgment that the reasoning in the deference argument is sufficiently widespread and appealing to warrant extended discussion, let alone an excursus (inspired by Thomas Nagel's famous article, "What is it like to be a bat?") on the distinction between metaphysical and empirical gulfs in our access to one another's experience (73ff).

The next few chapters are concerned with both the epistemic plights and privileges of certain categories of victim. On the one hand, the

claims of victims may not be taken seriously because they contradict what we believe or would like to believe . . . If victims make claims describing abuse at the hands of the powerful, problems of plausibility may combine with issues of credibility to facilitate cavalier dismissal of their narratives (87).

The default norms of testimony become problematic in such contexts. Many folks are therefore doubly victims; the injustice of social subordination is compounded by what Miranda Fricker calls epistemic injustice. But we should also guard against the opposite danger. "We may grant credibility or plausibility or both out of a sense of solidarity with the vulnerable and downtrodden. Such solidarity is enormously valuable in many contexts -- but not if it furthers injustice and inaccuracy" (108).

These are reasonable but unsurprising conclusions. Furthermore, the discussion is repetitious. For example, Govier once again tells us that

Dangers exist both when victims' testimonies are dismissed and when they are taken at face value . . . Victims may tell us what we do not want to hear, and we may dismiss it to protect ourselves from unwelcome news. Or . . . we may come to an overly deferential attitude to victims and uncritically accept their narratives out of respect and sympathy (128).

Consequently, these chapters seem a bit thin.

The remaining three chapters are more substantial and concern the appropriate responses of social and legal agencies to victims of wrongdoing. What these victims need from the community, Govier argues, is "vindication", not retribution. It is neither plausible nor appropriate to think of the aim of punishment as satisfying victims' desires for retribution. For one thing, individuals' feelings about retribution are too variable and manipulable to serve as a guide to criminal law. Besides, they are the wrong standard for determining questions of conviction and sentencing, which are not about victims but rather about "attitudes of the perpetrators and their place in communities" (149). For these reasons, Govier is skeptical of the practice of providing "victim impact statements" in criminal trials. Some victims are more retributive or more articulate than others, and the fate of offenders shouldn't depend on that. Instead, "the public phenomena [of conviction and punishment] are more plausibly interpreted as expressions of vindication" (160), which "means victory in a moral challenge that is achieved when it is recognized and articulated that persons harmed did not deserve the treatment they received and should have been treated better" (158).

It is not clear how Govier thinks this expressive aim of punishment is integrated with the offender-focused process of criminal conviction and sentencing. Perhaps the idea is that the whole process of criminalization and prosecution has the function of vindicating. In any case, she thinks that that the need for vindication is not only, or even adequately, served by criminal law. Victims need material as well as symbolic processes that help them recover from the harms of wrongdoing. This may include processes of restorative justice, which have partly inspired truth and reconciliation hearings.

These obviously aim at "healing" and repairing relationships, but Govier firmly opposes the tendency to frame these goals in terms of the prevalent but pernicious idea of "closure", which is not only obscure but (partly for this reason) cruelly unrealistic (196). Forgiveness will often also play a role in the work of restoration, but there is a danger that victims will be expected to take on the further burden of accommodating the point of view of their wrongdoers, including forgiveness, for example. But that will not always be good for them and not necessarily obligatory. Forgiveness of repentant wrongdoers might be appropriate in many cases, but there is such a thing, Govier emphasizes, as appropriate non-resentful non-forgiveness. This complex response involves a focus on healing and recovery that is different from the perpetrator-centered attitude of forgiveness.

Govier's book is full of telling examples and astute points. But much too much of it reads like a series of encyclopedia entries rather than sustained original arguments or analyses. Parts of it read like an elementary textbook. One wonders, for example, for which audience Govier felt the parenthetical remark in the following sentence to be helpful: "if [a certain] man claims to have been a victim of police brutality, he is rather unlikely to be believed. (Note: this is not to say that this claim is false. It is, rather, to say that many people will not accept his testimony)" (94)? Or to whom the following remark might be instructive: "If we know that someone has lied about similar matters in the past, is highly partisan or dogmatic, or has vested interests in one side of a story or another, those are reasons to question his credibility and not to take his testimony at face value" (129)? These banalities make sense as elementary lessons on critical thinking but are out of place in a philosophical monograph.