Violence and Civility: On the Limits of Political Philosophy

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Étienne Balibar, Violence and Civility: On the Limits of Political Philosophy, G.M. Goshgarian (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2015, 212 pp., $30.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780231153980.

Reviewed by Todd May, Clemson University


Étienne Balibar is one of the most rigorous thinkers of contemporary politics, especially European politics, that his generation in France has produced. A student of Louis Althusser, Balibar has consistently rejected shoehorning politics into a pre-given theoretical grid but has instead sought to understand political phenomena on their own terms. The current work is no exception. Violence and Civility, consisting of three re-worked chapters that were originally the 1996 Welleck lectures at Columbia bookended by a 1992 lecture on themes from Jacques Derrida's thought and a 2003 lecture from a conference in Paris, is an original and sustained attempt to consider the role violence and what Balibar calls "anti-violence" play in the formation of political relationships.

The book is dedicated to Derrida's memory. It is not hard to see why. Balibar sees a necessary haunting by violence of all political movements that seek to eliminate it -- that is, all political movements. Thus there is an economy of violence and the attempt to suppress it with which political reflection must come to terms. Among the implications of this is that, contrary to many utopian political movements of the twentieth century, "we must renounce eschatological perspectives, even in their secularized forms, which, as we know, were always insistent in the revolutionary discourse about politics, especially in its communist variants." (xiv)

What is violence, then? Balibar does not say. He notes that there are many forms of violence, and his examples include not only physical violence but also exploitation in the Marxist sense, domination, marginalization, and degradation. Much of the latter phenomena have been gathered under the rubric of structural violence, a term to which Balibar occasionally has recourse. However, what is of interest to him specifically are two forms of extreme violence, of what he calls cruelty, that are often intertwined but that, he insists, must be recognized in their distinct specificity. These he calls ultraobjective and ultrasubjective violence.

He contrasts these two forms of violence in this way:

the first [ultraobjective] kind of cruelty calls for treating masses of human beings as things or useless remnants, while the second requires that individuals and groups be represented as incarnations of evil, diabolical powers that threaten the subject from within and have to be eliminated at all costs, up to and including self-destruction. (52)

Or again:

one of which [ultraobjective] proceeds by way of an inversion of the utility principle and the transformation of human beings into not useful commodities but disposable waste, while the other proceeds by installing in place of the subject's will the fetishized figure of an 'us' reduced to absolute homogeneity. (61)

Ultraobjective violence is usually more of a structural matter. As an example, we can consider Marx's unemployed "industrial reserve army," those who are ready to work but have no employment. However, if we are to do so, we must abstract from this example the role the industrial reserve army plays in keeping wages low. Ultraobjective violence reduces its objects to masses without any role whatsoever. In contemporary politics, undocumented immigrants (a common example in French leftist discourse from Alain Badiou to Jacques Rancière) might serve as a privileged case. By contrast, ultrasubjective violence, of which Nazism provides the most extreme example, is a more nearly psychological phenomenon. The other is an Other, a foreign object or a disease that threatens to infect or debilitate the group and for that reason must be eliminated. As contemporary cases we might think here not only of the racist view of undocumented immigrants but also of Israel's treatment of the Palestinians, including those Palestinians that are Israeli citizens.

While distinct, these two forms of cruelty are in Balibar's view often engaged with each other. He borrows the image of the Möbius strip from the thought of Jacques Lacan to illustrate their relation. A Möbius strip is created by taking a strip of paper, twisting it once, and then attaching the two ends together. If one travels the length of such a strip, one will start on the outside and wind up on the inside before returning to the outside again and vice versa. The two sides of the strip are separate, but they lead to each other. Balibar views the relation of ultraobjective and ultrasubjective violence in this way. This is not difficult to see in our world. In the US, for example, public discourse about undocumented immigrants tends to include both themes of surplus -- they are stealing our jobs or bleeding our welfare system -- and of evil -- they are raping our women and creating violence in our cities.

The urgent question for Balibar is one of how to deal with such violence? He does not believe it can be eliminated -- or, more precisely, he believes that the threat of such violence cannot be eliminated. This, he thinks, is one of the great political lessons of previous centuries, particularly the past one. Thus he rejects, in a long discussion, Hegel's view that negative violence can be "converted" into positive violence: a violence that will eliminate cruelty. He notes that Hegel is

constantly engaging in two quite dubious, and what is more, inseparable operations on which the very possibility of internalizing violence depends. One consists in restricting the 'historically' significant instances of violence to certain specific forms that are in fact always already 'political'; a second consists in idealizing the effects of political violence less by downplaying the ravages and suffering they cause than by imposing meaning on them. (49)

What goes for Hegel also goes for Marx, although Balibar is careful to note that Marx's own view is a nuanced one. There is, on the one hand, a recognition of irrecuperable violence in Marx's thought, and yet, on the other, Marx often tilts toward a teleological view that posits the absorption of violence in the communist society.

If violence, or at least its threat, cannot be eliminated, what can be done to address it? Balibar briefly considers and rejects two options before embracing a third. The two he rejects are nonviolence and counterviolence. Nonviolence is to Balibar an "abstraction" (22) from violence. It fails to recognize that violence is always a threat, opting instead to occupy a position that seeks to be beyond the threat of violence. Counterviolence, by contrast, seeks to invoke violence against violence, hoping to end violence by violent means. This strategy, however, is simply an "inversion" (22) of violence, one whose consequence is often to repeat the cruelties that it set out to oppose. Instead of these two strategies, which share a false commitment to the idea that the threat of violence and in particular of the extreme violence of cruelty can be terminated, Balibar believes we must embrace a strategy of anti-violence or civility. He insists that "unless a politics of civility is introduced into the heart of the politics of transformation, indications are that the latter will not by itself create the conditions for emancipation (but only those of another form of servitude)." (104)

What, then, is civility? Although Balibar discusses several arenas for a politics of civility, he does not have much to say directly about its character. His discussion is more focused on the violence it seeks to prevent or at least keep at bay. However, from that discussion we can draw out his meaning. Civility, at a first go, is the attempt to ward off cruelty, to be cognizant of the twin but distinct threats of ultraobjective and ultrasubjective violence, and to counter them within whatever politics of transformation is being embraced. This, in turn, would require recognizing what might be called broadly the humanity of others: their distinct lives with their distinct dreams and hopes and projects and loves. (We will leave aside a discussion of the recognition of the "animality" of non-human animals, although it would be relevant at this juncture.) This recognition resists the reduction of others to an anonymous surplus or a diabolical Other. As Balibar would undoubtedly be the first to note, such a recognition is difficult on the terrain of political struggle. Such struggle often brings out the worst in both oneself and others and therefore poses an eliminable threat of a descent into violence and even cruelty. That is why, for Balibar, anti-violence or civility is never finished as a project and politics is always "precarious." "The idea of the precariousness of politics can be associated, it seems to me, with a modality of contingency that in some sort inscribes risk and discontinuity in everyday life (or, better, in the everyday reality of conflict)." (97)

Regarding strategies of civility, Balibar has isolated three: what he calls the hegemonic, the majoritarian, and the minoritarian (the latter involving a reference to Deleuze and Guattari's "becoming-minor"). The hegemonic is a state strategy, one that seeks to impose civility through the institution of Sittlichkeit, a normalizing morality. This, Balibar notes, is a Hegelian strategy, and its drawback is precisely in the imposition of a potentially overweening normality. Majoritarian and minoritarian movements, in contrast to hegemonic ones, operate from below rather than above in the state. They, however, have their own dangers.

We might say that the majoritarian viewpoint constantly detects a danger of ultraobjective violence in the "micropolitics of desire," whereas the minoritarian viewpoint constantly sees a danger of ultrasubjective violence (a recurrent fantasy of sovereignty) in the "macropolitics of emancipation," producing what could be called the antinomy of antistate civility. (124)

The latter danger is straightforward. Where revolutionary movements seize the state in the name of liberation, there is often a temptation to root out minority opposition as a diabolical or, in a medical image, cancerous growth within the population. The danger of ultraobjective violence, I take it, is one of ignoring structural concerns that are outside the realm of minoritarian desire, and so running the risk of reproducing or leaving intact the cruelty associated with such violence.

Balibar's reflections in Violence and Civility, as elsewhere in his work, are subtle and at times profound. This review has only covered the major through-line of the text, leaving fascinating reflections on Spinoza, Marx, Hobbes, Hegel, and our contemporary situation to the side. In a mere 150 pages, he has offered analyses of the kind I have not seen elsewhere, and they have awakened me to a new perspective on our current situation. I will end this review with two questions, neither of which is meant to be a refutation of Balibar's claims but rather ways of continuing the conversation he has opened.

The first question concerns the character of violence. Balibar uses the term to cover a broad swath of territory and concedes at the outset that there are many types of violence. One wonders, however, what all these different kinds of violence have in common that draw them into a single category. I am not asking here for a definition of violence itself. In composing a recent book on nonviolence, I sought to come up with a definition of violence that would cover all of its instances and failed miserably. Along the way I studied many other definitions, all of which I found wanting. However, Balibar seeks to confront, not all violence, but a number of specifically political forms of violence. One wonders what, for instance, structural violence has in common with the ascription of diabolical character to another that makes them both instances of violence, indeed for him instances of extreme violence or cruelty. My suspicion is that an answer to that question would lead back to concepts like dignity, humanity, and integrity, which would place his view in productive conversation with more traditional political views. I say this not as a criticism of Balibar's approach but rather as a way to place it in a context in which it can engage with other political views that at first glance it might seem distant from.

The second question concerns Balibar's view of nonviolence. For him, nonviolence is a utopian notion, one that has a teleological character and therefore resists recognizing the inherent political tendency toward violence. This, however, is not a view that would sit easily with those who have theorized about nonviolence. For them, and here I include Gandhi and Martin Luther King, Jr., as well as more recent theorists like Gene Sharp, the naïveté associated with such a view would be distant from their own approach. In fact, they are clear that violence is often a temptation, and they see the necessity for strict discipline among those who struggle in order to avoid it. In fact, one might say, they are committed to the view that "unless a politics of civility is introduced into the heart of the politics of transformation, indications are that the latter will not by itself create the conditions for emancipation (but only those of another form of servitude)." In other words, what Balibar offers under the name of civility is, perhaps, continuous with one of the central commitments that characterize nonviolent political action: a respect for the other and indeed for all others. If this is right, then one way to read Violence and Civility is as a contribution to a politics of nonviolence, a politics that, in our world, would be welcome indeed.