Violence: Thinking Without Banisters

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Richard J. Bernstein, Violence: Thinking Without Banisters, Polity, 2013, 228pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745670645.

Reviewed by Seyla Benhabib, Yale University


Violence has accompanied human culture from its earliest beginnings, and representations of violence in art, narrative and song are ubiquitous. Yet it is only in certain periods that violence emerges as a major preoccupation of political thinkers: Machiavelli's The Prince (1532); Edmund Burke's Reflections on the Revolution in France (1790), Ernst Junger's Storm of Steel (In Stahlgewittern, 1924) and Georges Sorel's Réflexions sur la Violence (1908) are major works that have explored violence in different periods. Why has violence resurfaced in contemporary thought in the first decades of the twenty-first century?

Richard Bernstein observes that

We live in a time when we are overwhelmed with talk, writing, and especially images of violence. Whether on television, the internet, smartphones, films, or the video screen, we can't escape representations of actual or fictional violence -- so much so that we easily become numb and indifferent to still another report or depiction of violence (viii).

The consequence of this inflation of violent images is a certain sloppiness in our thinking and deep confusion about what is meant by violence. Bernstein does not engage this confusion in our culture directly but by way of a critical dialogue with five seminal thinkers: Carl Schmitt, Walter Benjamin, Hannah Arendt, Frantz Fanon, and Jan Assmann. Like so much of Bernstein's work, this book is masterful in displaying the hermeneutical skills of patient and lucid exegesis and hard-hitting criticism.

The choice of Schmitt, Benjamin, Arendt and Fanon is not arbitrary. Walter Benjamin's 1921 essay "Zur Kritik der Gewalt," translated as "Critique of Violence," was greatly admired by Carl Schmitt. Benjamin in turn took himself to be inspired by Sorel's concept of the "general strike" in the latter's Réflexions. Arendt, who was a close friend of Benjamin's and an editor of some of his posthumous works, and who herself wrote two different essays on violence, passed over in significant silence her young friend's musings on this question. Frantz Fanon's, The Wretched of the Earth, and in particular, Jean-Paul Sartre's Introduction to it, are in turn the object of Arendt's vehement objections and polemics.

Why has the 28-year old Walter Benjamin's essay continued to exercise such influence? Hardly noticed (except by Carl Schmitt) or debated when it was first published, Benjamin's essay was subsequently included in a collection of his writings edited by Theodor W. Adorno and Gershom Scholem in 1955, and reissued ten years later in a small German volume edited by Herbert Marcuse with an Afterword. Since then thinkers such as Adorno, Jacques Derrida, Jürgen Habermas, Giorgio Agamben, Martin Jay, and more recently, Judith Butler, Simon Critchley, Slavoj Žižek have returned to it. Benjamin's essay is dense and apocalyptic, frequently positing distinctions that are hardly clarified. Benjamin distinguishes between "law-making" and "law-preserving" violence, thus scrambling liberal conceptions of the legitimacy of state power originating in some consensual contract. "[A legal contract]," he writes,

however peacefully it may have been entered into by the parties leads finally to possible violence. It confers on each party the right to resort to violence in some form against the other, should he break the agreement. Not only that: like the outcome, the origin of every contract also points to violence (quoted in Bernstein, 51).

Benjamin thus washes away distinctions between the legitimate exercise of power and coercion and illegitimate violence. Not only the origins of the state but its continuous existence for him rest on violence.

It is not difficult to see why such a theory would appeal to critics of liberalism and constitutionalism and, more specifically, to those who reject any Kantian or neo-Kantian theory of the state as resting on the rule of law, the protection of human rights, the rights of citizens, popular sovereignty and the like. But it is not the distinction between law-making and law-preserving violence alone that has led to the spilling of much ink; rather it is the tantalizing one between "mythic" and "divine" violence, which has challenged one and all. Mythic violence is law-making as well as law-preserving violence (55), whereas "Justice (Gerechtigkeit) is the principle of all divine endmaking, power (Macht) the principle of all mythic lawmaking." (Benjamin, quoted by Bernstein, 55) How is such divine violence to be understood? Who declaims it? How do we recognize it? Bernstein works through a number of interpretations which read into Benjamin's concept of "divine violence," not just a flirtation with apocalyptic politics such as the Sorelian revolutionary violence of the oppressed manifested through the general strike (Marcuse) or Leninist "real politics" that grabs state power (Žižek), but which also parse Benjamin's text as endorsing "nonviolent violence" (Butler) or an "ethical" form of violence (Critchley).

Bernstein agrees with Derrida and Dominick la Capra that Benjamin's distinction between "mythic" and "divine violence" has a "seductive allure" (75) and that Derrida is not unjustified in claiming that "despite all its polysemic mobility," Benjamin's essay, resembles "too closely, to the point of specular fascination and vertigo, the very thing against which one must act and think, do and speak" (Derrida quoted by Bernstein, 70). In other words, "the critique of violence" (the title of Benjamin's essay) threatens to morph into a glorification of violence. Bernstein resists this reading but agrees with Derrida that the undecidability of Benjamin's text lends credence to such a move; instead, he prefers to see in Benjamin's essay an essential reflection on all issues that an analysis of violence must face and a warning that we can never know "with certainty whether the consequences of our actions break the cycle of mythic violence or reinforce it." (77)

I am less convinced by the indispensability of Benjamin's essay to an analysis of violence, and see in the loose and fast way in which distinctions are posited and claims made about history and society rather the expression of a certain spirit of the times, marked by the collapse of the old order in Europe, the violence and carnage occasioned by World War I, the fragility of the doomed Weimar Republic and a pending sense of even worse violence to come.

If Benjamin nonetheless held faith in a divine form of justice to arrive on earth and destroy mythic violence, Carl Schmitt made the distinction between friend and foe the sine qua non of the political realm. And contrary to such fashionable readings of Schmitt as advocating an innocent form of "agonistic" competition between rival political parties (Chantal Mouffe), Bernstein is clear that for Schmitt "War is not the 'continuation of politics by other means.'" (21) He observes that "We fail to do justice to the existential seriousness of politics unless we realize that it entails the real possibility (but not the necessity) of physical killing at those times when we believe that our very way of life, our existence, is threatened by an enemy." (21) Yet surely it cannot just be his alerting us to the ever-present possibility of violence in human life that has occasioned what Bernstein names a "veritable [Schmitt] tsunami." (12) Rather, as Bernstein rightly observes, many find Schmitt's approach to politics, which avoids the rationalism, normativism and moralism of contemporary "suffocating" Kantianism (13-14), refreshing and see in it one of the most "trenchant analysis of liberalism" (13). How then are we to evaluate the lack of any justification in Schmitt for his "normative-moral stance" (43) or for his discrimination among three types of enemy: the conventional, the real and the absolute? Who is an absolute as opposed to a real enemy? Is there a way out of "aporias of Carl Schmitt" (Bernstein) without engaging in rationalism and normativism?

If Benjamin and Schmitt show the instability of the distinctions between law-making and law-preserving violence, friend and foe, and war and political antagonism, it is Hannah Arendt's achievement to insist on the differences between power, violence, force and strength. Against the conflation of power and violence, which she names the "command-obedience model" of power (80), Arendt introduces the concept of power as the "human ability to act in concert," and much of her political writing documents those episodic moments in human history when power is exercised through acts of revolution and resistance, sometimes giving rise to a novo ordo seclorum. The very concept of "political violence" for Arendt is self-contradictory. Whereas political action is based on "binding and promising, combining and covenanting," (Arendt, On Revolution quoted in Bernstein, 84), violence is mute and can always destroy power; yet even as Arendt herself admits: "nothing . . . is more common than the combination of violence and power, nothing less frequent than to find them in their pure and therefore extreme form." (Arendt, On Violence, quoted in Bernstein, 85). Isn't Arendt undermining her own distinctions then with this admission? Arendt's answer is that political philosophy must precisely bring to light those distinctions that have been forgotten with the rise of modern societies, such as between labor, work and action, and thinking, willing and judging. Political philosophy for Arendt is the "art of making distinctions."

Although she was not a pacifist and thought that there were occasions when the use of violence was quite legitimate, such as defending oneself against Hitler's armies by fighting as a Jewish army, Arendt was undoubtedly right in reminding us of the power of non-violent resistance, whether individual or collective. In the words of the late Jonathan Schell, who was much inspired by Arendt,

This is the promise of Mohandas K. Gandhi's resistance to the British Empire in India, of Martin Luther King Jr.'s civil-rights movement in the United States, of the nonviolent movements jn Eastern Europe and in Russia that brought down the Soviet Union, and the global success of democracy in its long contest with the totalitarian challenge. . . . The century of total violence was, however, discreetly, also a century of non-violent action.[1]

Both Arendt and Schell point out that the relevant political question never is whether or not to engage in violence, but to clarify which political options are open and which are closed and to judge among the politics of violence and non-violence. Although violent resistance is certainly sometimes justified, as Arendt admits in her discussion of Fanon's The Wretched of the Earth (1961), one must also consider the political institutions that emerge out of such violent resistance and the damage that violence inflicts on the psyches of all involved. Bernstein agrees with Arendt in reading Fanon's work not as a glorification but as a critique of violence (122ff).

The most surprising chapter is the penultimate one on the great Egyptologist and cultural philosopher Jan Assmann, who in 1977 published his controversial, Moses the Egyptian: The Memory of Egypt in Western Monotheism. Assmann is concerned with "mnemohistory," that is, the past as remembered, narrated and passed down in memory. It is not so much the historical question whether Moses was not a Jew but a rebellious Egyptian priest or nobleman, which concerns Assmann, but rather the distinction between Hebrew and Egyptian cultures and peoples as narrated and recollected in Jewish memory through such central rituals as the Passover celebration of the liberation of the Jews from Egyptian bondage. And at the heart of this memory is what Assmann calls "the first distinction" (Assmann quoted in Bernstein, 128), that is, "the distinction between true and false in religion that underlies more specific distinctions such as Jews and Gentiles, Christians and pagans, Muslims and unbelievers." (Assmann quoted in Bernstein, 128) How or why is this "Mosaic distinction" related to religious violence? It is hard to do justice to the hermeneutic complexities involved both in Assmann's text and Bernstein's discussion as refracted through Sigmund Freud's essay on Moses and Monotheism (composed from 1937-1939) in this brief space. But the question which preoccupies Bernstein is:

If the Mosaic distinction is as rigorous and as absolute as Assmann indicates, and if it introduces a new kind of religious truth -- 'absolute, revealed, metaphysical, or fideistic truth' -- that is radically opposed to all false religions, then it would seem that the Mosaic distinction is intrinsically violent. (143)

This is a disturbing conclusion not only because it echoes some of the well-known anti-Judaism of German thinkers who saw in Judaism a "religion of command and obedience" alone (Kant as well as the young Hegel thought so), but also because religious violence then becomes intrinsic to all monotheistic religions that distinguish between "true" and "false" religion. Bernstein quotes Assmann's use of Schmitt's categories in his Of God and Gods. "What, then, is religious violence? By this term I mean a kind of violence that stems from the distinction of friend and foe in a religious sense." (Assmann quoted in Bernstein, 151) Whereas Freud saw in monotheism a step toward spirituality or intellectuality (Fortschritt in der Geistigkeit), toward Enlightenment, Assmann appears more ambivalent toward the enlightening legacy of monotheism, in the sense that both violence and progress seem contained in this step.

Unlike Benjamin, for whom divine violence would bring transformative justice that would right all wrongs, for Assman any concept of the monotheistic divine is itself marked by the "murderous distinction" that carries the seeds of political as well as religious violence. Given how deeply monotheism is imbricated in the fibers of our culture, what is being said then?: that we, the legatees of Jewish, Christian and Muslim monotheisms, are condemned to repeat cycles of violence -- a view which Bernstein also seems to endorse? (177ff.) How can the level of abstraction at which such assertions are made really help us understand the entangled history of religious borrowings and competition, of coexistence as well as toleration? It is too easy to posit "the limits of toleration" to have been just an Enlightenment illusion without analyzing historically and philosophically the ways in which monotheistic religions have had to incorporate into their own doctrinal and political hermeneutic the existence of "other" truths, thus struggling with forms of tolerance as aspects of religious doctrine.[2] Nor can such a culturalist perspective explain why and how Sunni and Shi'a or Serb and Bosnian populations, which had coexisted for centuries, all of a sudden erupt in violence. The theory of the "murderous distinction" explains too much and too little: it explains too much because it postulates the intrinsic propensity toward religious violence at all times and among all monotheistic peoples, and it explains too little because when violence erupts it has little to say about why or how, under these particular circumstances, here and now?

I have to ask whether Bernstein, despite his balanced and sagacious reading of all these thinkers, is not too indulgent of theories of violence that, with very few exceptions, lack historical and socio-economic specificity. Is it plausible to flirt with theories of violence in order to free oneself from the "stultifying Kantianism" of the present? When the chips are down and distinctions need to be made between legitimate power and structural violence, symbolic violence and the like, how are we supposed to be able to do that without normative thinking, whether Kantian or not?

We need to remind ourselves of Jonathan Schell's words:

in a steady and irreversibly widening sphere, violence, always a mark of human failure and a bringer of sorrow, has now also become dysfunctional as a political instrument. Increasingly, it destroys the ends for which it is employed, killing the user as well as his victim. It has become the path to hell on earth and the end of the earth. This is the lesson of the Somme and Verdun, of Auschwitz and Bergen-Belsen, of Vorkuta and Kolyma; and it is the lesson, beyond a shadow of a doubt, of Hiroshima and Nagasaki.[3]

[1] Jonathan Schell, The Unconquerable World. Power, Nonviolence, and the Will of the People (A Metropolitan Book: New York, 2003), p. 9.

[2] See here Rainer Forst's impressive work, Toleration in Conflict. Past and Present, trans. by Ciaran Cronin (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2013).

[3] Schell, The Unconquearable World, p. 7.