Virtue and Happiness: Essays in Honour of Julia Annas

Placeholder book cover

Rachana Kamtekar (ed.), Virtue and Happiness: Essays in Honour of Julia Annas, Oxford University Press, 2012, 351pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199646050.

Reviewed by Marco Zingano, Universidade de São Paulo


This Festschrift for Julia Annas, who has been presenting so many brilliant ideas to so many people over so many years, is a much-deserved homage to an influential and inspiring scholar. Much of Annas' work has focused on ancient ethics, with a special emphasis on Plato. This volume has a similar focus. Its authors serve the reader well since they fittingly reassess and reexamine some subtle and difficult problems related to Annas' work.

Mark McPherran writes on 'Socrates' Refutation of Gorgias: Gorgias 447 c-461 b'. Commentators have raised concerns about Socrates' elenctic examination of Gorgias in the eponymous dialogue, particularly about the way he leads the discussion and makes Gorgias contradict himself. This is because Socrates seems to make use of not only his own elenctic method, but also, and more importantly, because he resorts to extra-logical persuasive devices akin to sophistry and mere rhetoric. McPherran contends that, for Plato, even the consummate philosopher will sometimes employ such devices. For resorting to them, and in general to dialectical arguments so construed, even though they inevitably make the refutation ad hominem, does not show that Socrates' method is contaminated by them, and thus would have to be philosophically amended. Plato does not recommend making an appeal to these sophistic methods as a primary way of discussing an issue. He only advocates using such methods when confronting sophists who must be brought to blatant contradiction via their own questionable methods. As long as philosophy keeps to its goal of discovering truth and looking for the realization of human nature, it is not infected by rhetoric and simple dialectics when employing their strategies. This is because the latter have different goals, basically ones connected with the pursuit of wealth, goals contrary to those that guide philosophical enquiry. At the same time, the two other parts of the dialogue illustrate that such logotherapy also has limits (i.e., the intellectual and moral qualities of its subjects) even when employing sophistic devices tailor-made to the interlocutors. For Pollus and Callicles show by their attitudes that twisted souls may become simply deaf to any logotherapy, as they are no longer able to be helped or cured by the Socratic elenchos.

Jonathan Barnes, in his witty paper 'Justice Writ Large', revisits Plato's strategy of studying justice first in society in order to detect afterwards its nature in the individual. This is a crucial move in the Republic, a dialogue focused on the notion of justice: in order to know what justice is for an individual, inside his soul, considered as it were microscopically, we should first see what justice is like in the whole city, macroscopically. The claim is clearly couched in Platonic terminology in II 369a3-4: first finding out what sort of thing justice is in a city and afterwards looking for it in the individual, tên tou meizonos homoiotêta en têi tou elattonos ideai episkopountes, "looking at the likeness of the larger item in the form of the smaller".

But is it a legitimate move? Annas had qualms about it, for justice in the one case -- in cities -- may prove to be distinct from, or not reducible to justice in the other case -- in individuals. Is it just a matter of equivocation? Should we start by asking whether "Athens is just" and "Aristides is just" in the same or in a different sense of "being just"? Socrates' argument does require that 'just' is not equivocal. Barnes contends that Socrates is correct for obviously in both cases 'just' stands for 'being disposed to act in such-and-such a way', even if States have no souls as individuals have, and consequently 'just' is differently applied in each case. There is thus no threat of equivocation, or at least not of this sort of equivocation. Having ruled out a second charge of equivocation, dubbed equivocation on concepts, Barnes examines a third case of equivocation: whether 'just' picks out the same form of justice in cities and in individuals. In IV 434d1-4 Socrates alludes to the issue of accepting or not accepting the same form of justice in both cases. But if any discrepancy pops up, one will reassess justice in the State, revising it with the aim of bringing it back into harmony with soul's justice. A bit earlier, at 435b1-2, there was mention of the same form of justice (kat' auto to tês dikaiosunês eidos) -- the same and unique form that may manifest itself in different ways in individuals and in States, but such that the form remains the same throughout all its cases. This is not a special case for the form of justice, since it is true for any other form: whenever the same word is correctly applied to different items, however different they may empirically be, all these items share one and same form. Now, this argument vindicates the claim that justice is the same, writ in large or in small letters -- but, as Barnes pleads, it is a bad argument, at least for the form of justice. The result is that it is not true that Plato simply asserts, without any proof, that it is the same 'justice', writ in large or small letters. Rather, that claim is pretty evidently false, or so Barnes argues, and saying that such an assertion is only left with no obvious ground cannot but be a polite way of not straightforwardly declaring it false. This is a quite negative approach towards Platonism, which Barnes seems to openly advocate as he unfolds his arguments.

These two first papers give a very good idea how intense and rewarding the whole volume is. Unfortunately, there isn't space to present more than the main claims of the other papers. Nicholas Smith's 'Plato on the Power of Ignorance' attempts to understand infallibility of knowledge and fallibility of belief in a new key, as he distinguishes between cognitive states and powers, the latter producing the former, having subject-matters and being about or of something, whereas powers are the causal bases for these judicative states. He then engages in a new reading of the much-disputed Republic V, where Plato claims that knowledge and belief have separate objects. C. C. W. Taylor, in 'The Role of Women in Plato's Republic', reassesses the position women have in Plato's ideal State, highlighting the role the principle of specialization has, a principle which is not a moral imperative, but a requirement for the existence of the ideal State.

Paul Woodruff, in 'Justice as a Virtue of the Soul', underscores the dependence of civic justice on individual justice. He makes two claims: one more scholarly, according to which the direction goes from individual justice to civic justice in Plato, so that a just State presupposes just citizens; and a more general thesis, that Plato is right about this link between personal and civic justice. Malcolm Schofield, elegant as always, shows in his 'Injury, Injustice, and the Involuntary in the Laws' that there is continuity and commitment to Socrates' intellectualism as the Laws reasserts the dictum that nobody errs voluntarily. But he also claims that this dialogue works in a new direction, as injuries caused involuntarily call for retribution and punishment according to an established code of laws. Daniel Russell ('Aristotle's Virtues of Greatness') examines Aristotle's virtue of magnanimity. He tries to show that there are traces of elitism in such an uncommon virtue (since it is restricted to wealthy and privileged people). As a result such an analysis will be at odds with Aristotle's own virtue theory overall, since its direction is rather the opposite.

Richard Bett asks ''Did the Stoics Invent Human Rights?'. Through a detailed analysis of the relevant texts, he shows that, despite the evidence for a Stoic notion of community among all human beings, their assignment of a special status to the wise has the consequence that the wise form a community of equals to which the rest of humanity cannot hope to have access. As a result no robust notion of human rights can be found in Stoicism. This consequence follows from a broader difficulty that the Stoics face concerning the position of the wise towards the rest of humanity, namely that they may be considered as founders of human rights only to a very limited extent.

Rosalind Hursthouse ('Excessiveness and Our Natural Development') rejects the view that humans become rational all of a sudden, at the so-called age of reason, as if children entirely lacked the capacity to make judgments. Instead, she pleads for a more plausible and proper account of our natural development, distributed essentially into two strands of children's practical reason.

In a brilliant display of scholarship and acute analysis, Anna Maria Ioppolo '(Chrysippus and the Action Theory of Aristo of Chios') examines chapter 23 of Plutarch's De stoicorum repugnantiis. In it, Chrysippus is presented as criticizing those who hold that there were accidental motions in the soul, such that, when the soul faces indistinguishable things, it draws from itself an inclination towards one or another by means of a contingent power. Ioppolo focuses on the chapter's structure, aiming to show that the chapter provides elements for a reconstruction of a dialectical argument between the philosophy of Chrysippus and that of Aristo, the dialectical confrontation not being exclusively polemical. In his example of two drachmas that are indistinguishable in stamp and brilliance, Chrysippus must have aimed precisely at a comparison with Aristo's philosophy, allowing that the criterion of choice can be left to an inclination of the mind when the things in question are of little importance. This does not, however, lead to performing an irrational and unmotivated action, for the agent can provide a justification for the choice (as in the case of two runners who reach the finish line together).

In 'How Unified is Stoicism Anyway?', Brad Inwood comes to grips with the alleged strict unity of Stoic philosophy, arguing that such unity has been largely overestimated. He considers Cato's argument in De finibus about the extraordinary coherence of all three traditional parts of philosophy (§§ 3.74-75), the passage often quoted in support of strict unity. After a minute analysis of the passage, Inwood suggests that we should try not to be immediately seduced by the enthusiasm of Cato's character in the dialogue, but instead should look for an appropriate way to assess the interconnection between the various theses and doctrines, considering their merits case by case. In this way we may raise serious doubts about the nature and degree of the unity claimed for Stoicism.

Anthony Long ('Plotinus, Ennead 1.4 as Critique of Earlier Eudaimonism') pursues the idea that Plotinus, when his criticisms are placed in their historical context, looks remarkably well-informed about rival Aristotelian, Epicurean and Stoic views. Plotinus reconstructs their views in fairly minute detail (despite his reticentce to name their authors), He mounts a powerful challenge against their positions -- in this case, against their notion of eudaimonism. There is thus a combination of criticism and eclecticism in Plotinus' approach, but this is his dialectical way of making clear his own position by first raising and subsequently rebutting challenges couched in the terminology of the rival schools.

The last three essays are more loosely connected to specific authors or passages in ancient philosophy. Paul Bloomfield ('Eudaimonia and Practical Rationality') discusses the relations of practical rationality to happiness in connection with Sidgwick's stalemate between a fundamental dualism of practical reason (founded upon the impossibility of becoming happy by consistently performing virtuous actions, as morality) and self-interest, which inherently pull in opposite directions, making them mutually exclusive. Bloomfield proposes looking for ways in which both are so entwined that it makes no sense to try to separate them. A first move in this direction, he claims, is getting away from forms of non-naturalism in morality.

Mark LeBar and Nathaniel Goldberg ('Psychological Eudaimonism and Interpretation in Greek Ethics') revisit the topic of psychological happiness, and claim that such an idea is warranted by the conjunction of two ideas: Davidson's account of how we interpret others, and the ancient account of normative eudaimonism. Psychological eudaimonism, they claim, is shown to be true if one couples Davidson's strictures on interpretation with the eudaimonist structure of rationality common to ancient Greek ethics.

In the final essay, 'How (and Maybe Why) to Grieve like an Ancient Philosopher', Scott LaBarge studies the very interesting topic of how the ancients coped with bereavement. Reading passages from Plato, Cicero, Epicurus, Plutarch and others, LaBarge asks why the ancients were so reluctant to give themselves over to grief. A philosophical explanation of this fact seems to be grounded in two common features of ancient philosophy: the egoistic or personal happiness approach and the doctrine of the emotions. If we add to these a strong compulsion to rescue happiness from the ravages of Fortune, we find a probable explanation for their reluctance to give way to grief.

Rachana Kamtekar, the editor, wrote the volume's Introduction. She summarizes each paper, pointing out the connections each has with the work of Annas. This book is, as I noted above, a much-deserved tribute to Annas' scholarship and influence on central issues in ancient philosophy, especially those in ethics. It gives the reader a solid sense of how illuminating and influential the work of Julia Annas is.