Virtue and Reason in Plato and Aristotle

Placeholder book cover

A. W. Price, Virtue and Reason in Plato and Aristotle, Oxford University Press, 2011, 356pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199609611.

Reviewed by Dimitrios Dentsoras, University of Manitoba


In Virtue and Reason in Plato and Aristotle, A. W. Price offers a comprehensive examination of the ethical and moral psychological views of antiquity's two most celebrated philosophers. Price's goal is to paint a general picture of the moral and psychological framework within which Plato and Aristotle place human action, while doing justice to all the persistently challenging details that continue to engage scholars of ancient philosophy. The result is a renewed appreciation of the insightfulness of Plato and Aristotle's moral ideas, and of the closeness they often exhibit to our common moral and psychological experiences.

The book is divided into four parts, each discussing a central concept in Plato and Aristotle's ethics and moral psychology: eudaimonia, virtue, practical reasoning, and acrasia. Part One begins with a discussion of eudaimonia in the Platonic works, focusing on its function as the overarching goal that all actions aim at. Price's general description of eudaimonia identifies it with "doing well." This should not be understood merely as having one's life going the way one wishes, but as acting in a fitting and proper way. Everything, from material possessions to psychic attributes, is supposed to facilitate doing well and gains its value and desirability with reference to the way in which it contributes to acting well. Following this general description, Price places eudaimonia within the framework of practical reasoning and the theory of action. As he notes, the goal of acting well is not itself a reason for action, but rather a universal filter upon reasons.

Such a universal goal has to be abstract, to some extent, or else it would be substituted for by its more determinate equivalent. At the same time, though, it has to be determinable if it is to be active at all. The important question then becomes how this end can become more determinate, under different circumstances. With respect to this question, Price notes a difference between the "Socratic" works of Plato and the Republic. In the former, we find no definite answer regarding the way in which the ultimate goal of action can be specified and pursued (with the exception of Protagoras' hedonist calculus, which Price thinks does not express a view Socrates would endorse). In the Republic, on the other hand, Plato offers an account both of the necessary condition for being able to specify the abstract goal of eudaimonia (gaining access to the Form of the Good, which can guide one in every circumstance), and of the way in which the condition can be met (through the rigorous intellectual training of the city guardians). In addition, the Republic offers an objective measurement of what it means to be acting well, with reference to the internal harmony of the soul's parts.

Price moves on to Aristotle's account of eudaimonia in the following section, noting two features that Aristotle attaches to it: being all-inclusive and constituting the ultimate goal of action. According to Aristotle, each action primarily aims at acting well, which is what it really is to be happy. At the same time, in acting well we also get things that are valuable without being themselves instances of acting well, although they are valuable for their sake (such as pleasure). One may wonder what role these goods may play. Price's answer is that they form part of our practical deliberations. In these deliberations, eudaimonia constitutes an abstract goal that is achieved in different ways under different circumstances, by setting up a variety of intermediate goals. Concerning the abstract-yet-determinable nature of eudaimonia, Aristotle believes that there is a naturalistic objective basis for the proper evaluation of goals and means. Being able to set those goals and means is virtue's task (more on this function appears in the following parts). Price concludes the section with a discussion of some important further questions about Aristotelian happiness related to its completeness, the role of fortune in becoming happy, and the value of intellectual contemplation.

Part Two focuses on Plato and Aristotle's conceptions of virtue. Price identifies two basic functions of virtue that are indispensable in the achievement of happiness, the guiding and the executive functions. The former prepares the way for practical reasoning by setting the proper goal that needs to be achieved, while the latter consists in the proper arrangement of the agent's affective motivations (the emotions, or pathe), in line with reason's assessment. Every particular virtue fulfills this dual role in its own particular way. At the same time, all of the virtues form a unity, which is expressed in every instance of virtuous action. Price examines different alternative accounts of the Platonic unity of virtue, both in earlier works such as the Protagoras and in the Republic, reaching a rather indeterminate conclusion, according to which "the doctrine of the unity of the virtues can take many forms" (100). For Price, the important lesson from Plato's accounts of the unity of the virtues is that all of the virtues converge into a unitary and steadfast course when the virtuous agent performs an action, even if the action's particular nature and function may differ to a greater or lesser extent (depending on how we interpret Plato).

Price continues with a discussion of the Aristotelian unity of the virtues, in the following section. His main focus is on the way in which the various virtues calculate the mean, which constitutes their particular goal. Price makes a distinction between the mean as calculated from a virtue's particular perspective, and the mean as seen from the perspective of the other virtues. These two perspectives and evaluations may possibly differ: while it is neither rash nor cowardly to expose oneself to bodily harm in battle, from bravery's perspective, it may be unwise to do so when the battle is hopeless. The virtuous person balances the evaluations of the different virtues through a holistic approach, leading to an action that is generally most appropriate under the circumstances.

After identifying the general goal for the sake of which everything is done (happiness) and the way in which it is to be achieved (by acting well), Price moves to practical reasoning, i.e., the process that leads to every particular action, with the goal of acting well and being happy. Part Three begins with a discussion of Socrates' claim in the Gorgias that we all desire what is truly good (for us), and that evil people do not desire bad things, even if their actions apparently intentionally produce them. Price tries to make the Gorgias claim less striking by introducing the notion of 'the hypothetical desire to φ if φ is beneficial.' Since we all desire our eudaimonia, we all desire hypothetically the actions that are conducive to it, and desire hypothetically to avoid those that are detrimental to it. In that case, people who do evil things could be said to act contrary to what they desire, since whatever they try to attain is desirable if it brings eudaimonia, which it obviously does not.

This may make the Gorgias claim somewhat less striking, but it still fails to make a distinction between the material and the intentional objects of desire. The distinction is made in the Meno, where Socrates discusses the desire for bad things, which are mistaken for good, and in the Republic, where harmful desires are associated with the lower, appetitive part of the soul. Price discusses the nature of appetite and of its desires in the Republic and the extent to which appetite can reason, reaching an intermediate position, according to which appetite's evaluations enter practical reasoning even if appetite itself does not form rational inferences. Price then moves to the Republic's account of deliberation itself. His conclusion is that the Republic provides no general rules of action that apply universally. The only absolutely good thing is the Form of the Good. Knowledge of the Form is supposed to lead to knowledge of the general and intermediate goals that need to be pursued. But what exactly these goals are is dependent on circumstance. Plato offers us, therefore, no "rulebook that contains a blueprint for right living" (187).

Price's discussion of Aristotle's account of practical reasoning, in the second section of Part Three, begins with a note on the indeterminacy concerning the role of practical deliberation. At the outset, deliberation seems to provide the means to a given end and, therefore, to only have an auxiliary/advisory role. But there is more than that. On the one hand, practical deliberation initiates action, in the sense that what it concludes is, in the absence of any impediment, the starting point of action. Furthermore, practical deliberation seems to be involved, in some way, in the determination of one's goals. Price argues forcefully against the "grand end" view of eudaimonia, according to which practical reason is provided with a blueprint of what constitutes acting well, which it then tries to implement according to the circumstances. Instead, Price assigns a less radical view to Aristotle, according to which the end presented to practical reasoning is "rather a priority than a monomania" (203). Moreover, even distinctive ends are not fully specified, but need to be worked out by weighing different considerations related to one's circumstances. The resulting picture is that of a spectrum of ends, all subordinate to eudaimonia, ranging from life-goals that guide our long-term plans to proximate goals that change constantly.

Price's complex picture of Aristotelian deliberation might lack in clarity, but it is close to the way we actually think and act. Price makes a similar point with respect to Aristotle's views on the existence of absolute practical rules or principles. With some striking exceptions, Aristotle seems to think of general principles as indefinitely qualified (i.e. as applying for the most part), leaving open the possibility of violating these principles in favor of some others, if the occasion requires it. But, what provides the starting-point of deliberation, if it is not a 'grand end' supplying a full specification of eudaimonia, or some categorical principles? Price examines a number of possible answers to the question, noting that none appears clearly in Aristotle. The account Price endorses describes deliberation's starting-points as products of some sort of moral intuition, comparable to the intuition that provides the starting-point for scientific knowledge.

Part Four discusses the phenomenon of acrasia in Plato and Aristotle. Price begins by making a distinction between synchronic acrasia (weakness of judgment) and diachronic acrasia (weakness in perseverance). The existence of the former phenomenon (only) is famously denied by Socrates in the Protagoras. Price examines Socrates' argument and the ethical hedonism it is based upon, and concludes that Socrates's denial of deliberate self-harming action is intended to illuminate a particular psychological picture and should not be applied generally. He then evaluates the Protagoras' moral psychological theory by discussing different interpretations of it. Price himself remains indecisive, noting that "what Plato puts into [Socrates'] mouth rather omits a psychology than intimates one" (268). This stands in contrast with the detailed account of moral psychology that Plato offers in the Republic. Price discusses the Republic's competing account of acrasia, focusing not so much on the possibility of the phenomenon itself, but rather on Plato's understanding of mental conflict and the role of the virtues in avoiding it. The result is a rich picture of agency and motivation, which allows judgments to arise without the use of reasoning, but still be expressions of the agent's character, through the exercise of the lower soul parts.

The book concludes with a discussion of Aristotelian acrasia and related problems and scholarly disagreements. Price opts for what he calls "a fairly traditional reading" of the relevant passages (mainly EN 1146b-1147b) according to which Aristotle assigns a qualified ignorance to the acratic person. According to Price, appetite disturbs proper reasoning, not by preventing our logic, but by turning reason's attention away from premises that should be part of the practical syllogism. Failure to take these premises into account (for example, that the cake one is about to eat is unhealthy) results in action that is contrary to a whole set of other beliefs (about the good) that the agent holds. Aristotle's account, and any interpretation of it, is not without its difficulties, and Price discusses some of the most important. His goal is to offer an interpretation of Aristotelian acrasia that is in some agreement with our actual common experience of the phenomenon. The book ends by returning to Aristotle's conception of eudaimonia and the problems involved in explaining how one can appreciate eudaimonia as the ultimate goal, yet fail to act towards it.

Throughout the book, Price keeps a balance between paying attention to the most important contemporary debates over interpretation and retaining the big picture of what Plato and Aristotle's moral theories are trying to achieve. While Price often has something of interest to say about questions that have attracted contemporary interest, such as the role of spirit in the Republic, the reasoning abilities of appetite, or the existence of non-rational desires in the Protagoras, he also often refrains from taking a stance on either side of the debate. Usually, this is because he believes that any of the competing interpretations fit his overall account of eudaimonia and the deliberating process that aims at it.

When it comes to the big picture, Price seems content with laying out what he thinks are the most important and perennial aspects of Plato's and Aristotle's ethics and moral psychology, while admitting that many related issues (actually the ones that attract most scholarly interest) are hard, or even impossible to resolve in a satisfactory manner. In general, Price does not present or try to defend a challenging broader theory. The absence of a conclusion or epilogue at the end of the book is, I believe, indicative. A similar absence of an encompassing claim can be seen in Price's parallel treatment of Plato and Aristotle. While Price has a lot of interest to say about them separately, he only occasionally offers some illuminating remarks about the connection between them. For the most part, the Plato and Aristotle parts are autonomous and not explicitly presented as parts of a philosophical progress or debate.

In a few places, Price shows an interest in contrasting the ancient ethical theories with modern and contemporary discussions in moral philosophy (by arguing, for example, that Aristotle's account of the function of deliberation and reasoning is actually quite different from Hume's). These are interesting and fruitful comparisons, and it is unfortunate that they appear only sparsely, especially since Price clearly believes that Plato and Aristotle have something valuable to say, even from our contemporary perspective.

The book is mainly addressed to scholars and advanced students in the history of philosophy, especially those with an interest in ancient ethics and moral psychology. The passages Price discusses are often challenging and require a certain degree of familiarity from the reader, making the book somewhat inaccessible to a more general audience. But for those interested in ancient ethics and moral psychology, Virtue and Reason is a treasure trove of enlightening commentary, insightful arguments, and a keen view of the most important and perennial aspects of Plato's and Aristotle's genius.