Virtue Epistemology: Motivation and Knowledge

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Stephen Napier, Virtue Epistemology: Motivation and Knowledge, Continuum, 2008, 174pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826497949.

Reviewed by Guy Axtell, Radford University



Work in virtue epistemology (VE) requires familiarity with both epistemology and ethics, and invites reflection upon the similarities and differences between these subject matters. Stephen Napier demonstrates his clear expertise in both areas in this book, which also promotes a dynamic view of their interrelationship. According to Napier, the overall argument of the book is that responsibilism is a more promising and fuller account of knowledge than are virtue reliabilist and austere externalist anti-luck epistemologies (4). While concerned with the nature of knowledge, Napier also wants to claim that a key implication of responsibilist VE is

a shift away from analyzing epistemic concepts (knowledge, etc.) in terms of other epistemic concepts (e.g. justification) to analyzing epistemic concepts with reference to kinds of human activity … much of analytic epistemology centers on epistemic concepts, whereas the responsibilist focuses on epistemic activity (144).

Chapter 1 addresses the problem(s) of epistemic luck in ways that produce very interesting criticisms of Alvin Goldman’s epistemology and reliabilist treatments of the Gettier problem. Napier’s treatment of luck also helps him to develop his own distinctive, responsibilist reply to the “dilemma for the motivations of virtue epistemology” that Duncan Pritchard put forth in his book Epistemic Luck (2005). Pritchard had held that insofar as a virtue epistemology is reliabilist, its aretaic condition on knowledge is replaceable without loss by a modal “safety” condition, which (he claimed) adequately addresses veritic luck and precludes Gettier cases of luckily true belief from counting as cases of knowledge. Insofar as a virtue epistemology is responsibilist, then (according to Pritchard) it is internalist, addressed to the exclusion of another kind of luck that likely shouldn’t be considered knowledge-precluding, and even if it is, is replaceable with some more standard “general internalist condition” on knowledge. Napier’s analysis of luck and knowledge comes in answer to Pritchard’s objection that whether or not reflective luck is relevant to conditions on knowledge, veritic luck clearly is, and the responsibilist is unable to deal with the preclusion of these kinds of cases because qua internalist, its concern with luck simply looks in another direction altogether.

Napier, like many of the leading virtue epistemologists in the last few years, wants to defend the credit theory of knowing and to articulate an account of knowing as believing truly because of virtue. As Napier explains, “The purpose of the ‘because of’ clause is to block cases of double luck”, such as one finds in standard Gettier cases. He argues in support of Zagzebski’s view that since the Gettier problem really afflicts all fallibilist accounts of knowledge, the only way to insulate against re-gettierization of one’s analysis is to "define knowledge such that the truth is entailed by the defiens or to make an act of virtue (with certain noted qualifications) entail true belief"(4). The author holds that properly understood, his aretaic condition on knowledge serves to block Gettier or veritic luck (something that Pritchard and Axtell oppose in favor of a virtue epistemology) with an independent anti-luck condition. (Pritchard, ironically, has apparently found his own motivations for virtue epistemology in the meantime, and today a proponent of what he calls “anti-luck virtue epistemology”.)

Like Greco and Zagzebski, both of whom he counts among responsibilists, Napier’s understanding of virtue epistemology is that of a ‘compatibilist’, ‘mixed’ or ‘dual component’ account that includes both reliability and proper motivation components. He employs the concept of an aretaic condition on knowledge, cast in terms of belief arising from an “act of virtue” on the part of the agent:

First, responsibilism combines into one concept, a virtuous act, both an externalist-reliability component and an internalist-justification component. The gain made is purely conceptual, but a gain nonetheless over other theories that bifurcate their conditions for knowledge. Second, for the responsibilist, the internalist-justification requirement is ensconced in the concept of a virtuous act. As such, whether internally accessible justification is required is determined by the virtuous agent … Some circumstances would require internally accessible grounds, to some degree or other, and some other circumstances would not … A simple internalist-justification requirement on knowledge does not capture this contextual sensitivity, but the notion of a virtuous act does (13).

Responsibilists in epistemology, like virtue ethicists, strongly associate virtues with an agent having appropriate emotions and motivations. An emotion is understood as a state that combines both a cognitive and an affective component; motives are emotional states that initiate action, and are subsets of emotions — affective states that move the agent to act and as such serve, on this view, as the causal explanation for actions undertaken. It is the distinctive feature of responsibilism that a virtuous act is defined partly with reference to a motivational component. Napier’s initial clarifications of the advantages of a dual-component account (a type of account that Pritchard’s reduction of virtue epistemologies to internalist or externalist sorts ignores) are followed by later chapters in which he addresses the main problems he sees for the responsibilist view:

One in particular is called the problem of unmotivated belief. Since the responsibilist defines knowledge with reference to a virtuous act, which includes a motivational component, then all knowledge would be a function of one’s virtuous motivations. But clearly there are cases of easy knowledge, such as perception, memorial beliefs of the not-too-distant past and, relatedly, receiving simple testimony. Some of these problems are referred to as cases of easy knowledge, knowledge without credit, or cases of passive or simple knowledge. (15)

The author’s nicely organized discussions of these cases, and his replies to critics of responsibilism make up the bulk of the next chapters of the book. Here he further elaborates what responsibilism offers that reliabilist and austere anti-luck epistemologies do not. In cases of perception and memory, he brings together impressive empirical evidence to support the responsibilist’s contention that one’s emotional-motivational states are in fact implicated in the genesis of knowledge.

In the chapter on perception, Napier argues that perceptual knowledge requires attention and that attention is informed by epistemic motivations. Motivational states direct attention and what results from focused attention is awareness. Forming perceptual beliefs that count as knowledge requires that one be aware of one’s perceptual environment, such that perceptual knowledge is mediated by deep-seated motivated actions of the agent; the motivation to be aware is present in most or all cases correctly describable as perceptual knowledge, when we look at these closely and in ways informed by psychology and the special sciences. The unmotivated belief objection to responsibilism also arises with respect to memorial knowledge, where it claims support from cases in which intuitively either “(1) a veridical memorial belief is preserved but without attention, or (2) even if the preservation of a veridical memorial belief requires attention, the attentional focus itself is not directed by any motivation” (61). Napier’s chapter on this develops the “argument from encoding” to show that attention is necessary in memorial knowledge, as in perceptual knowledge, and that one’s motivations are necessary to direct one’s attention. The motivation involved in perceptual/memorial knowledge is, moreover, an epistemic one.

Napier’s chapter on testimony and cognitive virtue is perhaps his best, as he takes on the challenge of purported cases of testimonial knowledge of no credit to the knower or recipient of the testimony. There are, he holds, three parts to testimony: (i) the relationship between the testifier and the proposition shared, (ii) the communicative act by the testifier, and (iii) the reception by the receiver. “These three parts,” Napier asserts, “signify three distinct epistemic acts, and thus each part requires an analysis of its success” (91). Responsibilism, insofar as it defines knowledge with reference to a virtuous act, has built into it a contextual sensitivity that helps us clarify the three parts of testimony and the ways they relate to one another. Noting the advantages of taking an actor’s motivations as primary over epistemic states and standings, and virtue theory’s ability to recognize the social epistemological aspects of testimony, Napier goes on to argue that only the responsibilist versions of virtue epistemology can give a satisfactory account of testimonial knowledge.

In reflection on these chapters, one might well point out the “thinness” of the epistemic virtues functioning in perceptual/memorial knowledge and the “thickness” of epistemic virtues such as fair-mindedness, intellectual courage, or phronesis (73). In fact, however, there is a continuum of valuable or praiseworthy epistemic states that epistemologists evaluate, and the thin/thick trait distinction is helpful in that task:

Thin virtues are intellectual virtues insofar as they possess an epistemic motivation, but such motivations function largely nonconsciously and if acquired are acquired without much conscious effort. Whereas thick intellectual virtues possess a more robust epistemic motivation and acquiring the virtue may take effort and requires consciously repeating, say, fair-minded acts (74).

The responsibilist may thus account for low-grade knowledge by noting that it still requires the agent to exude an epistemic motivation, though only one associated with thin, perhaps ‘faculty’ virtues. Nevertheless the responsibilist account still maintains its key notion of motivation or intentionality, describing it through the thick intellectual virtues needed to account for personal and doxastic justification with respect to reflective or high-grade knowledge. For “higher-grade knowledge is knowledge which is the result, typically, of extended inquiry”, and the reflective virtues are traits that make us good at inquiry. In this way responsibilism avoids the approach of unreformed internalist epistemologies, while providing a needed corrective as well to contemporary externalist analyses of knowledge that leave intentionality or motivation out of the picture.

The author’s positive program shines through in two concluding chapters, one on moral expertise and the other applying virtue epistemology to the problem of divine hiddenness. Responsibilists hold that valuable epistemic states like knowledge, understanding, sensitivity, etc. are generated by valuable traits of the agent. A person’s motivation and overall moral character also contributes to the acquisitions of these epistemic goods: “If one accepts responsibilism, one must view with suspicion the idea that intellectual pursuits are not impregnated by one’s moral character” (143). In neo-Aristotelian or phronomic virtue responsibilist accounts, like Napier’s and Zagzebski’s, the judgment of what the phronomos would, might, or would not do often constitutes the best criterion of proper moral reflection and judgment. On this view, persons of virtue may themselves disagree, but Napier suggests that this isn’t particularly troubling to the theory, though it is still an interesting truth indicating that we inhabit “an axiologically deep and complex world” (128).

In Napier’s final chapter and conclusion he suggests that a virtue epistemology of the responsibilist sort can quite naturally demarcate the limits of human inquiry, with considerable implications for claims about religious and moral knowledge. The frequent impasses between theists and non-theists will enable the person with phronesis to recognize the approaching limits of human knowledge and thereby display appropriate epistemic humility and caution. Napier focuses on the argument for athiesm from divine hiddenness developed by Schellenberg. It is troubling for a theist to acknowledge the apparent fact of reasonable or responsible (virtuous or non-culpable) non-belief. It is troubling in a way that motivates a concern to explain God’s ways to man, or to explain how He remains ‘hidden’ to many and how the matter of His very existence and nature, in philosophical terms, is epistemically ambiguous. Napier points out that the concept of a virtuous agent applies to objects that are within the domain of human knowledge, but the counterfactuals of God’s freedom that this impasse between theists and atheists presupposes are not the proper objects of human knowledge. The impasse over divine hiddenness is due to each side conducting inquiry that is intuitively outside the boundaries of human insight. Thus the virtuous agent for whom God is hidden should adopt an agnostic position, not atheism as argued by Schellenberg. The responsibilist virtue epistemology applied to philosophy of religion more generally gives a reason for limiting claims to human knowledge: “The claim to know, one way or the other, is inapposite” (140); "the intellectually virtuous agent would confine her claims to know relative to the inscrutable nature of the domain" (139). Thus outlining the boundaries of good inquiry helps dissolve not only the impasse regarding the hiddenness argument, but also the more general claim of individuals or institutions to be holders of religious knowledge.

In reflecting on Napier’s accomplishment, I find much to admire in the book including his ability to bring empirical support to the contention that recognition of motivation and attention are crucially at work not just in testimonial and memorial knowledge, but in perceptual knowledge as well. Of the main points he claims responsibilism provides us — (i) retention of the idea that a person who knows is personally justified in the sense of being rational, justified, or intellectually good, (ii) a sound account of the value of knowledge, and (iii) a Gettier-proof theory of knowledge — I will pose a question regarding the first and third.

I mentioned earlier the tension between Napier’s concern with action rather than conceptual analysis, and his overall argument that responsibilism is a more promising account of knowledge than is offered by virtue reliabilist (A. Goldman) and austere anti-luck (D. Pritchard circa 2005) epistemologies. Like Zagzebski in Virtues of the Mind, Napier wants to utilize qualities of the agent such as intellectual virtues in defining knowledge, rather than to steer the project of analysis into different projects or interests in the virtues, as internalists like Foley and responsibilists like Lorraine Code describe themselves as doing. An autonomous or ‘two-project’ approach leaves the responsibilist to link epistemically-central concerns with responsible habits of inquiry, while not insisting on any conceptual connection between personal justification through the virtues and conditions on propositional knowing. (This squashes the perception that the virtues are only of central epistemic interest if their formal definition contributes to a successful analysis of propositional knowledge.)

Thus, for those who don’t think value of the virtues in epistemology has to do primarily with elucidating what knowledge is, Napier’s characterization of virtue responsibilism seems somewhat restricting; it saddles responsibilism into the position of what Jason Baehr (2008) calls “Strong Conservative VE” but counts as only one of four main varieties of character-based virtue epistemology. In some ways, Napier insists on the connection between personal justification and action-in-inquiry, but he doesn’t clearly acknowledge the possibilities of strong (radical) or moderate “autonomous” versions of character epistemology (including J. Kvanvig’s). Nor does he clearly acknowledge differences between the internalism in which his approach is steeped and the pragmatism of those I’ve elsewhere called inquiry-focused or zetetic responsibilists (like Code, Chris Hookway, or Axtell and Olson). Hence Napier’s responsibilism, a view that utilizes qualities of the agent like intellectual virtues in definition or conceptual analysis of knowledge, represents a Zagzebskian slant that makes it look rather too restrictive. Considered in another way, however, his characterizations of responsibilism may also be too loose, since Napier includes the self-described “agent reliabilist” John Greco as a responsibilist. Greco allows both objective justification (the reliable etiology of belief) and subjective justification (appropriately motivated agent) to be fulfilled through the agent’s manifestation of intellectual virtues. (Sosa’s alternative language of aptness and aptness plus, requiring an epistemic perspective on one’s faculties, would likely also qualify.) Greco, however, would share little of Napier’s internalist construal of the relationships between propositional, personal, and doxastic justification.

This ties in with my concerns about the attempt to strengthen the “because of” virtue claim (not only in Napier but among Zagzebski, Sosa, and Greco as well) in order for an aretaic condition to serve as an anti-Gettier condition in an analysis of knowledge. I have to register some scepticism of the view Pritchard calls “robust VE”, and of Napier’s close identification of responsibilism with it. Why must there be a necessary connection between truth and the other conditions of knowledge in addition to truth, whatever they are? What are the costs of such a move back away from fallibilism? Perhaps we should also be concerned with the objection that virtue-attribution takes place only in folk psychology — that we are guilty of many ‘fundamental attribution errors’ in attributing reflective virtues to agents, just as we are in attributing ethical character traits, as the “situationists” have it. Or perhaps the existence of robust and global intellectual traits isn’t the problem, but in attributing them to actual situated agents we yet face what Baehr calls a “new generality problem” of describing these habits and actions in inquiry at the right level of generality for the cases with which we are dealing. If either or both of these are serious problems, then the idea of “creditability for truth” is going to need considerably more explication. At the least, Napier does not reply to or acknowledge criticisms, such as that of “motive reliabilism”, which Michael Levin discusses in “Virtue Epistemology: No New Cures” (2004). The crucial problem that Levin finds with Zagzebski concerns her attempt to have an aretaic condition serve to preclude gettierization — an attempt that is crucial to Napier. Truth, Levin argues, cannot ‘arise from’ virtuous motives in any sense involving entailment or necessitation of truth, which is what the Zagzebskian motive reliabilist expects. Levin thinks “the trouble is that there is no notion of explanation able to fill the gap.” Truth just does not ‘arise from’ these motives in any sense involving entailment or necessitation of truth, and virtuous motives shouldn’t be asked to explain truth in this way:

The absolutely critical issue thus becomes how truth is supposed to ‘arise [noncausally] from,’ or ‘due to’ or ‘explained by’ motives … Were knowledge belief whose truth is ‘brought about’ by certain sorts of motives, almost nothing would be known (Levin 2004, 2).

Despite these concerns, I highly prize much of what Napier argues in this book, both about personal justification and its relationship to epistemic value and about a needed shift towards analyzing epistemic concepts with reference to kinds of human activity. The approach of this book not only brings conceptual clarity to the question of what knowledge is, but also promises practical guidance for one’s cognitive life, a primary concern of all responsibilists. It should be of keen interest not only to those doing research in the area (who will be interested in its state-of-the-art responses to reliabilist epistemology), but also in the classroom (when a paperback version appears) as a clear, well-written text that brings the important differences between divergent strands of contemporary virtue epistemology into critical focus.


Baehr, Jason. 2008. “Four Varieties of Character-Based Virtue Epistemology”, Southern Journal of Philosophy 46, 469-502.

Levin, M. 2004. “Virtue Epistemology: No New Cures”, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69 (2): 397–410.