Virtue Epistemology Naturalized: Bridges Between Virtue Epistemology and Philosophy of Science

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Abrol Fairweather (ed.), Virtue Epistemology Naturalized: Bridges Between Virtue Epistemology and Philosophy of Science, Springer, 2014, 360pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319046716.

Reviewed by Sarah Wright, University of Georgia


This is a collection of nineteen papers, assembled and briefly introduced by Abrol Fairweather. Together they explore an incredibly broad and fertile range of the connections between virtue epistemology, cognitive psychology, and the philosophy of science. Fairweather brings the chapters into dialog with each other by grouping them into sections representing different "bridges" between areas that might initially seem disparate or separated by a "precipice." The first bridge starts from empirical results in psychology and applies them to the intellectual virtues. Both positive and negative arguments are put forward; some empirical results mesh well with and provide support for an account of the intellectual virtues, but other results seem to undermine either specific claims made by virtue epistemologists or even the possibility of reliable epistemic virtues. Within this section, Fairweather (with Carlos Montemayor) offers a response, arguing that a wider range of empirical work supports the reliability of our cognitive abilities and hence of the intellectual virtues.

Fairweather's second and third bridges head in the other direction, applying virtue epistemology to the philosophy of science and the history of science, respectively. The target of application in many of the chapters in this section is the problem of underdetermination of theory by evidence, as well as the suggestion, also made by Pierre Duhem, that scientists can use bon sens in evaluating theories that are empirically equivalent. Underdetermination is a theoretical worry; in response we might look to the practice of science to observe how such concerns about theory choice have been addressed in the history of science. Further articles in this section offer hope in the form of some quite compelling historical examples of success in science. These case studies are offered as exemplars from which we might learn how to engage in theory choice using our intellectual virtues as a guide.

The fourth and final bridge concerns a topic of interest in the philosophy of science -- understanding. We might take understanding to be the best attitude we can have towards a body of information, but how shall we understand understanding? The debate here is between an account of understanding as an Aristotelian knowledge of causes, and the cognitive achievement account of understanding on which knowledge of causes is neither necessary nor sufficient for understanding. This topic already has an integrated normative component, as understanding is thought to have more epistemic value than knowledge. This normative element is expanded when we consider whether taking a virtue epistemic approach privileges one account of understanding over the other.

The chapters collectively cover an impressively wide array of topics, each with a connection to the central theme. In addition they are arranged in such a way as to create partial dialogues between them. Over and above the careful and compelling arguments presented within the chapters, some of the most important conclusions one can draw from this volume come from the way that the arguments, concerns, and methodologies in the different chapters interact. I will focus here on the two constructed "dialogues" that I found the most illuminating.

The chapters addressing Fairweather's first bridge, applying empirical findings to virtue epistemology, include Christopher Lepock's and Fernando Broncano's. Both focus on the psychological category of metacognition; each highlights a different role for it within a virtue epistemology. Lepock argues that those reliable belief forming processes that are not intellectual virtues, and that do not yield knowledge, can be marked by their lack of metacognitive control. He offers metacognition as a mechanism for John Greco's requirement that virtues be cognitively integrated, as well to explain Ernest Sosa's claim that virtues arise from our inner natures. While individual perceptual and cognitive processes may provide us with true beliefs, they only do so within a specific range of contexts; the monitoring and control functions of metacognition can increase their reliability through selective application of those processes. One might be concerned that requiring metacognition would re-introduce the regress of justification that virtue epistemology was introduced to avoid; however, Lepock points to the specific understanding of metacognition in psychological research. Its methods of monitoring and control need not be conscious, nor do they require explicit representation of the object level. Metacognition can then be used to explain why Norman's clairvoyance is not an intellectual virtue and does not provide him with knowledge. Though possessed of a reliable process, Norman lacks the metacognitive control required to selectively apply his ability. Lepock's use of metacognition can explain many important features of intellectual virtues and particularly of the intellectually virtuous person in whom the virtues are holistically unified.

Broncano points out many of the same details about metacognition that make it well-suited to explain the intellectual virtues. But he insists that more than metacognition is needed in order to reach the level of reflective knowledge; the relevant epistemic agency requires that we be able to take a first- person perspective. This perspective allows us the ability to take calculated epistemic risks; the "daring to believe" of this chapter's title. It is only by possessing the ability to understand and take such risks that we achieve the higher degree of control required to become responsible (and praiseworthy) for our true beliefs.

In contrast, Carlos Montemayor argues that knowledge does not require reflection; in fact, reflection may be incompatible with knowledge. Focusing on the example of Diana the Huntress used by Sosa, Montemayor uses terminology from perception research to claim that her arrow shooting requires "motor-control skills" while her choice of targets requires "action-selection skills." He agrees with Hilary Kornblith in claiming that the second, reflective type of skill may have a lower degree of reliably than the first used on its own. In addition, he points to recent empirical work that seems to show that the systems underlying these two types of skills are independent from each other. Perceptual illusions, like the Müller-Lyer illusion, affect the output of our action-selection skills, including our verbal reports; but, perhaps surprisingly, our motor-control skills are unaffected. This is taken to show that motor-skills are a good candidate to serve the role of the stable dispositions needed for the epistemic virtues, which generate knowledge. Montemayor reserves a place for action-selection skills in other epistemic pursuits like understanding, but holds that they are not relevant to the production of knowledge. While this conclusion is certainly shocking, the overall argument makes clear use of empirical findings to support it.

Berit Brogaard argues against both virtue responsibilist and virtue reliabilist accounts of knowledge, while still reserving a place for a eudemonistic virtue epistemology focused on intellectual flourishing. She follows others in arguing that even those who demonstrate no responsibilist intellectual virtues can still have basic sensory knowledge. She points to the psychological study of sleepwalking and savants to supplement these arguments. Savants, while possessing extreme mathematical ability, often lack any responsibilist intellectual virtues; yet they know their mathematical conclusions. Sleepwalking depends primarily on dorsal stream processing which may not be accompanied by any conscious awareness. On the assumption that responsibilist virtues require conscious effort, Brogaard concludes that the sleepwalker has knowledge that does not plausibly depend on exercising virtue. Reliabilist virtues might adequately capture the cases above, but she argues that they run into difficulties explaining knowledge when our cognitive successes are the result of joint effort. Rather than rejecting virtues, however, Brogaard recommends moving from a knowledge-focused virtue epistemology to one that takes intellectual flourishing as its target. The virtues endorsed by such a eudaemonist view may be quite different from the intellectual virtues currently endorsed by either the responsibilist or the reliabilist; they will only include those traits that contribute to one's overall intellectual flourishing.

Though it may not be a full defense of responsibilist virtue epistemology from Brogaard's objections, it is important to recognize that there are versions of this view that do not require the possession of intellectual virtues for knowledge. Linda Zagzebski's account of knowledge (Virtues of the Mind, Cambridge University Press, 1996) only requires that the agent act in the way that that virtuous person might and from the correct motivation. The various savants considered here fit into Zagzebski's definition of knowledge in an interesting way. At least some of these people clearly lack intellectual virtues; but they also seem to be uniquely motivated by the truth. This could be classified as a love of truth, the correct motivation, but one that is focused on an extremely limited range of topics. We might question whether savants act as the virtuous person would, since they have extraordinary abilities that exemplars of intellectual virtues might not. But it does seem that they reason as the intellectually virtuous person would, if the virtuous person had all their calculative and recall abilities. The case of savants offered here shows why a definition of knowledge that does not require intellectual virtue might be more plausible in its attributions of knowledge.

Mark Alfano questions reliabilist virtue epistemology from a different angle, extending the situationist challenge he has raised for responsibilism to reliabilism. His focus is beliefs based on inference. A troubling point is that we make persistent errors in reasoning about likelihood when we use the heuristics of availability and representativeness. Since use of these heuristics appears to be widespread, Alfano argues that reliabilists face a dilemma: either admit that these heuristics are not reliabilist intellectual virtues and accept the resultant skepticism about inferential beliefs, or find a way to argue that, despite appearances, these heuristics are in fact reliabilist intellectual virtues. Exploring ways that one might embrace the second horn of this dilemma, Alfano considers and develops an evolutionary argument that our methods of reasoning have been selected over time, and so must work well enough. In response, he points out that adaptation does not guarantee reliability, and the environment we find ourselves in is significantly different from that of our evolutionary ancestors.

Fairweather and Montemayor respond to Alfano's specific situationist challenge for virtue reliabilism about inference, while at the same time presenting suggestions for defending virtue responsibilism as well. One such defense is to shift attention to the wide array of inferential reasoning that is based on cognitive dispositions and may not be represented explicitly. An example they give is how we learn syntax as infants. Such learning seems relevantly inferential, yet it does not depend on occurrent reasoning, and (most importantly in this context) it is highly reliable. By including many reliable inference mechanisms in the evaluative pool, Fairweather and Montemayor are responding to the skeptical horn of Alfano's dilemma; a more limited and local skepticism about particular inferences does not fall afoul of our general anti-skeptical inclinations. Such a response admits that the highlighted inferential dispositions are not reliable; a more radical response would be to argue that, despite appearances, they are reliable. There are two suggestions offered to support his type of response. One would be to follow Sosa in evaluating the reliability of dispositions only under normal or expected conditions. The other would be to follow Gerd Gigerenzer in acknowledging our inferential heuristics as dispositions that are ecologically rational; they may be more reliable than would be any attempts by cognitively limited agents to follow ideal epistemic rules.

An important methodological point about the application of empirical results to epistemology is made apparent here by the juxtaposition of the chapters in this section. When applying empirical results to theory, interpretation matters. Individual empirical results don't (often) challenge our theories of rationality directly. However a body of empirical studies with a clear and completing interpretation can give us reason to change our epistemic theories to accommodate them. This issue is apparent in the response given by Fairweather and Montemeyor to Alfano. Both chapters address the same empirical findings, but those empirical findings are viewed through two very different interpretative lenses. The empirically robust result that people regularly make the conjunction fallacy when reasoning about the Linda case can be interpreted as a persistent and compelling problem that undermines the possibly of reliabilist virtues. However, when this result is grouped with a wide range of conclusions based on following a representativeness heuristic, it might instead appear as an isolated, if robust, foible in an otherwise reasonably affective strategy.

Likewise, if we interpret metacognition as an essential element in keeping our ground-level capabilities in check, and thus as what provides the reliability to those processes, then metacognition seems to be required for knowledge. This is the interpretation of empirical findings addressed by Lepock and Broncano. However, if we follow Montemayor in conceiving of our ground-level processes as independent from metacognition, then ground and meta-level processes can be evaluated for their reliability separately. If the reliability of our ground-level processes is higher than that of the meta-level, then metacognition seems not to be required for knowledge. These two results follow from different interpretations of the empirical findings. We might be driven here to go back to the empirical level, not necessarily to require further experimental evidence, but rather to consider which interpretations and empirical theories are best supported by all the evidence available. Choices like these raise the problem of underdetermination of theory by evidence, to which the chapters making up Fairweather's second and third bridge are responses.

Milena Ivanova considers the problem of underdetermination and examines attempts to solve this problem using two types of virtues: virtues of theories and virtues of theoreticians. While both might seem to move us towards resolving underdetermination, Ivanova argues that neither can provide us with a way to settle on a unique theory as best. Though theory virtues might help us to weed out clearly unsuitable candidates there is still much disagreement about the ranking of theory virtues, as well as when they are instantiated and to what degree. Is a theory simple if it has simple equations? Postulated fewer ontological types? Fewer ontological tokens? If virtues of theories are not enough for unique theory choice, we might look instead for scientific practitioners to make this choice for us. Ivanova turns to Duhem's concept of bon sens and to recent interpretations of it as an epistemic virtue. But she finds this interpretation problematic, particularly because bon sens can only be judged by success of the theory in the long run. Since epistemic vices may succeed in this way, particular instances of bon sens may be vices instead of virtues. Furthermore, two scientists with bon sens may still disagree; even the putative virtue does not resolve the problem of underdetermination.

Guy Axtell also addresses the problem of underdetermination, but comes to a very different conclusion from Ivanova. He argues for a "tiered" account of theory virtues and epistemic virtues on which it is not always possible to distinguish between them. But whether or not they can be distinguished from each other, they should be considered as working together and evaluated as a whole. This approach, he thinks, also provides us with a better interpretation of Duhem's bon sens. Axtell identifies his approach as a kind of normative naturalism, to be contrasted with rational reconstructionism. Rather than stripping scientific methodology down to some minimalist hypothetico-deductive roots, then adding in virtues as a response to the problem of underdetermination, normative naturalism looks at the whole practice of science in situ, recognizing that, while there is no guarantee, we are often able to resolve underdetermination problems with our full suite of scientific practices.

D. Tulodziecki examines details of the historical example of puerperal fever in the mid-1800's in an instance of a general methodology of using case-studies to determine what theoretical virtues have helped in theory choice in the past. This empirical examination of theory choice is contrasted to the in-principle arguments offered by the anti-realist. The historical reasoning about puerperal fever shows us that the (dirty) hand-hypothesis had theoretical virtues: it had could better explain the observed patterns of disease, it had consilience with the explanation of another (hitherto unrelated) disease (erysipelas), and it generated novel predictions about who would develop puerperal fever in the future. Tulodziecki argues that, given the success of this theory, we have reason to count these listed features as relevant virtues of theories, since they have in fact facilitated reasonable theory choice. These virtues serve as empirical evidence against the in-principle anti-realist argument that such choices are always undermined by the problem of underdetermination.

Shannon Vallor also focuses on historical examples, not of virtuous theory choice, but of epistemically virtuous scientists. She uses the examples of Robert Hooke and Barbara McClintock to illustrate her central virtue of perceptual responsiveness. This virtue plays a role in science similar to that played by phronesis in Aristotelian virtue theory. It is an overarching virtue that integrates the many and varied abilities and sensitivities needed by scientists in a range of different sciences and time periods. Perceptual responsiveness requires the correct motivation, captured in a particular way of seeing the world. The focus of this motivation is the "emergent contours" of the world, features discovered and shaped through an interactive 'conversation' with the phenomenon. While possession of this scientific virtue does not require moral virtue (and the exemplars given are not noted for moral virtue), Vallor suggests that the sensitivity needed for the virtue of perceptual responsiveness might be an adaptation of the skills in personal relation needed for the moral virtues. One interesting feature of this virtue and its dialogical structure is that it is best exemplified in an entire scientific life, rather than being visible through actions in particular experiments.

Marilena Di Bucchianico gives us an in-depth case study of the study of super conductors, both low and high temperature. This area of science has provided difficult questions that have seemed unresolvable and have led to what she describes as a "balkanized" theory community. She focuses on a particularly deep split that she says has led to two different traditions in the field: the descriptive and the principled traditions. The descriptive tradition, represented by Kamerlingh Onnes and Fritz London, aims first for completion and accuracy in capturing all the experimental results. The principled tradition, represented by Richard Feynman, looks instead for an explanation of the phenomenon. It is into this gap that Di Bucchianico fits John Bardeen's work, which aims to satisfy elements of both traditions. She argues that Bardeen is an exemplar of the virtue of scientific phronesis, and that phronesis may be the only way to bridge the divisions between scientific methodologies that may develop in response to difficult problems.

The articles in this section taken together provide us with some compelling evidence that underdetermination, while a theoretical problem, can often be successfully addressed by exemplary scientists who are considering all of the relevant strengths and weaknesses of competing theories. When working in a scientific context, it often becomes clear to those engaged in theory choice just which considerations are more important and which are irrelevant or less important.

Such success looks surprising if we start by stripping the scientist's tools down to a bare hypothetico-deductive method and then consider whether adding back in considerations about the virtues of theories or the epistemic virtues of practitioners is sufficient to solve the problem of underdetermination. As Axtell argues, this method of rational reconstruction misses something important about the way science is successfully practiced. This framing leads naturally to the conclusion that no added virtue elements will provide sufficient grounds for making an informed theory choice. But this result follows from an underlying assumption that we are looking for an algorithm to provide a definitive choice between theories. That is what the hypothetico-deductive model aimed to provide, but the added virtue elements don't fit neatly into any algorithm. Even if Ivanova's arguments lead us to the conclusion that no algorithm for generating unique theory choice exists, this does not show that epistemic virtues are of no help with the problem of underdetermination. Rather than looking at theory virtues and epistemic virtues in isolation, we need to consider the roles they will play in the life of an epistemically virtuous scientist, one fully trained in a field who has a background of past experiences to refer to. While we cannot generate a canonical ranking of theory virtues that holds across all contexts, an epistemically virtuous scientist working on a particular problem may well make an informed choice that, say, simplicity is more important than fecundity in this context. And this choice can lead the scientist engaged in inquiry to accept rationally one theory over another.

Virtues of theories on their own are useless without the judgment of virtuous individuals to consider them. This fact serves as a good reminder that though virtue epistemology often focuses on individual virtues, the primary unit of evaluation is the agent who possesses, or lacks, those virtues. Fairweather, in his introduction, takes as definitive of virtue epistemology the priority of values such that "epistemically valuable states of agents confer epistemically valuable properties on their beliefs." (1) The chapters in the section that focuses on case studies of individual scientists provide a fertile ground for considering the epistemic virtues as they are actually practiced. Both Vallor and Di Bucchianico focus on scientists who have successfully balanced competing concerns and as a result exhibit the type of phronesis required for intellectual inquiry. Since the Aristotelian virtues, including phronesis, are learned through imitation, having concrete cases to study is illustrative, not only for those theorizing about scientific reasoning, but also for those who aim to develop their own virtuous reasoning in a particular science.

While I could only consider two of the many themes in this volume, they represent a small sample of the wide array of fruitful interactions between the chapters. Anyone interested in virtue epistemology, philosophy of science, or naturalized epistemology should consider this book an excellent resource.