Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View, Oxford

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Swanton, Christine, Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View, Oxford, 2003, 328pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 199253889.

Reviewed by George Harris, College of William and Mary


In Virtue Ethics: A Pluralistic View, Christine Swanton gives the following definition of virtue:

A virtue is a good quality of character, more specifically a disposition to respond to, or acknowledge, items within its field or fields in an excellent or good enough way.

She then proposes that the various forms of virtue ethics should be understood as employing this definition in constructing different theoretical positions that satisfy at least two conditions: (I) they differ from non-virtue-ethical approaches such as consequentialism and deontology by giving a virtue-derivative account of right action and (ii) they are designed to answer the following set of questions:

  1. What are the modes of moral response or acknowledgment comprising the profiles of the virtues?
  2. What are the modes of moral response determinative of rightness?
  3. What are the bases of moral responsiveness?
  4. What is it to act from a state of virtue?
  5. What characteristics make traits of character virtues?
  6. What are the targets of virtues?
  7. How does virtue enter into an account of rightness?
  8. What are the limits of morality understood in a virtue-ethical way–that is, what is the shape of the virtues, and how is that determined?
  9. What epistemology should a virtue ethics possess?

Written for advanced specialists in moral theory, the book is framed within a technical vocabulary that requires concentrated effort to master before its contributions can be appreciated. Even those who are already familiar with a good bit of the virtue-ethics literature will have to orient the issues to her terminological framework. Also, patience is required because of the way the book unfolds. One way to present a view in relationship to the above list of questions and other views is first to describe the view independent of how it answers these questions and independent of how it responds to other views and then show how it answers the questions better than other approaches. Another way (taken by Swanton) is to construct the view along the way to answering these questions and in the process of showing how other views require adjustments to adequately answer the questions on the list. The latter approach can sometimes make it difficult to get a clear understanding of just what view we are supposed to be accepting. With this in mind, I will focus on constructing an overview of the kind of account Swanton would have us accept with minimal reference to the questions, to other thinkers, and to other literature and only then turn to a few critical remarks.

So what is the view? With the exception of some of its features that might be rejected without rejecting the heart of the framework, the view is something very near the following. The most fundamental normative moral concepts are the concept of virtue and the associated concept of character. Here the concept of good character-trait-profiles is central to understanding the kind of pluralistic virtue-ethics being recommended. Virtues have profiles containing a plurality of functions, a plurality of modes of moral acknowledgment, and a plurality of targets (objects of moral concern). A virtue’s function-profile includes its integrative functions, its expressive functions, and its creative functions by way of its multiple modes of moral acknowledgment. In addition to the promotion of value, a virtue’s acknowledgment-profile contains universal love and self-love, respect for persons and proper authority, and various modes of creativity. And a virtue’s target-profile includes the many objects that can be integrated and expressed by various modes of moral acknowledgment. When we understand all this, we will understand why virtue and character have the fundamental status at the heart of a virtue-ethics approach to ethical theory.

First, having the virtues is having set of good character traits that embed a complete and pluralistic set of good forms of moral acknowledgment: promotion of value, the bonding and attachments that go with universal love and self-love, the distancing that comes with respect for persons and respect for proper authority, and the various modes of creative expression. This aspect of virtue has the function of connecting us to the world and providing us with many objects of concern to be integrated into a good life.

Second, the plural modes of moral acknowledgment that are expressed in good character-trait-profiles require that good character-trait-profiles have integrative functions that bring unity to this plurality and expressive functions that allow the virtuous person to coherently express a life that honors all these modes of acknowledgment in an integrated way. This explains why moral concern is many and not one but nonetheless a substantially integrated whole. How integration is achieved will be addressed later, but now what is central is that the view we are being asked to accept is one in which no one mode of moral acknowledgment dominates all other forms of moral acknowledgment. Each operates as a constraint on the expression and integration of the others to achieve a coherent whole. This means that we should reject any monistic view that either acknowledges only one form of moral concern or gives lexical priority of place to a single form of moral concern across all moral contexts.

Third, another part of the view that we are being asked to accept is that possessing the virtues raises the question of right action in a certain way and provides the grounds for answering it. Possessing the plural acknowledgment-profiles of good character traits gives us reasons to care about the targets of the virtues “as the demands of the world” and about how these demands can be reconciled and integrated in a coherent way in terms of action. Indeed, the issue of right action just is how to integrate, reconcile, and express the demands of the world as they press upon a person of good character. The positive view that we are being asked to accept then is the view that right action is action that satisfactorily meets the demands of the world, the demands of honoring the targets of the virtues as objects of plural modes of moral acknowledgment. Among other things, this means that we should reject views that reduce the demands of the world to the demands of what contributes to our flourishing.

It also raises a fourth issue of the relationship between the demands of flourishing and other demands of the world, the issue of the demandingness of morality. Because of the joint constraints of self-love and the limits of human nature, the demands of the world are modest rather than severe. Because of the legitimacy of self-love as a form of moral acknowledgment and because of the frailty of human nature, the other demands of the world (promotion of value, universal love, respect, and creativity) must make a healthy place for the expression of self-love. Not to do so is not only to ignore human frailty, it is to dishonor a form of moral acknowledgment and an important demand of the world. Similarly, to emphasize good health and flourishing in a way that does not express extensive concern for the other demands of the world is to elevate flourishing in a way that dishonors the other forms of moral acknowledgment and the other demands of the world. An action is wrong then when it is vicious, and it is vicious when it can be described as not properly responding to the demands of the world in the way that the person with good character would respond. Neither eudaimonistic, virtue-theoretic, nor non-virtue-theoretic approaches can account for these features of right action.

Finally, to possess the virtues requires the capacity to integrate and reconcile a plurality of concerns and demands of the world. The achievement of this requires a moral epistemology that involves a context dependent procedure of carefully specifying the contexts in which conflicts arise. The model here is Henry Richardson’s specificationism, the view that integrating a plurality of concerns does not require appeal to one covering value across contexts, as monistic theories assert. Rather, successful integration is often achieved by seeing how the conflicts are resolved by a proper understanding of the particular features of the contexts in which they arise. In Richardson’s terms, if conflict among distinct ends persists, further specification of the ends and the contexts in which they arise can often reconcile them without recourse to a single overriding value. Possessing the virtues means possessing the virtues of practice, which include the virtues of inquiry and wisdom about how to specify ends in their various contexts. It also means being open to the views of others and the kind of searching dialogue required to properly respond to the demands of the world.

All this is rather big picture stuff abstracted from the great detail of Swanton’s book. Many important issues she discusses have been omitted that require careful critical scrutiny. My concern in this part of the review, however, has been to provide a sketch of a big picture that will facilitate the reading of her important book.

Now for some brief critical response to the structure of her project.

Most appreciably, Swanton’s pluralism is a welcome and important contribution to pluralism. Her account is complex and provocative, surely to be probed by the philosophical community. My own estimate is that the success of Swanton’s project will not ultimately be judged by its response to the primary opponents she considers in her book (value monists and eudaimonists like Rosalind Hursthouse, Julia Annas, and Philippa Foot, who make flourishing the centerpiece of virtue ethics). She has made her own distinct contributions to the mounting critical response to those views, but the ultimate success of her project turns on how she responds to other pluralists who reject both monism and the flourishing conception of eudaimonistic virtue ethics.

Here are two looming and related problems. The first is the form of her rejection of the flourishing conception of eudaimonism, and the second is a wider problem of what I will call the naturalist requirement. On the flourishing conception, right action flows unimpeded and without psychological conflict from the nature of the sufficiently mature virtuous agent. To experience psychological conflict over doing the right thing is to reveal that virtue has not been fully achieved and that one is not fully realizing one’s nature. On the flourishing view, then, there is a naturalistic requirement on any account of virtue to show a causal connection between our nature, right action, and an unconflicted psychology. Swanton rightly rejects this view and consequently endorses a different version of the naturalistic requirement. On her view, the task of moral theory is not to show a connection between our nature, right action, and an unconflicted psychology but to determine what virtue requires of us constrained by facts about our nature. What she believes is that, though much of what morality requires of us can flow from an unconflicted psychology, there is important residue that cannot. Therefore, we should not expect the life of virtue to guarantee our flourishing and an unconflicted psychology, even with the attainment of mature virtue. The contrast with the flourishing conception of the naturalistic requirement is that the constraint conception weakens the causal account required by an adequate naturalism. It eliminates the requirement for a causal account of the connection between right action and an unconflicted psychology by reducing the demands of the causal account of the relationship between our nature and what morality demands of us: morality can only demand what our natures can supply.

The difficulty is that the constraint conception of the naturalistic requirement has its own problems and creates tensions within Swanton’s own account. If the demands of the world are explained by appeal to our character and justification is ultimately founded on an action’s honoring the demands of the world, then there must be a causal account of the relationship between our nature and right action. This means that the naturalistic requirement must be more than a mere constraint on moral theory. It requires that any proposed moral theory must provide a causal account of how right action flows from our nature. So the eudaimonists are not wrong to insist on this point. What they are wrong to insist on is that the causal account must show that right action flows from an unconflicted nature that results in human flourishing.

They are wrong not because morality (causally unconnected with human nature) sometimes requires one thing and human nature another but because the structure of moral theory must be understood as requiring a naturalistic inquiry into the conflicts that exist deep within our nature that upon reflection are not mere frailties but part of what we value most in ourselves and others. We do not achieve such an account either by requiring a causal account of how right action flows from an unconflicted psychology or by reducing the naturalistic requirement to a mere constraint on moral theory. Rather we enhance the naturalism requirement to demand a causal account of how right action flows from conflicted human nature in a way that unconflicted psychological flourishing cannot be guaranteed.

This has implications for how to interpret the role of eudaimonia in an adequate virtue ethics. Hursthouse, Foot, and Annas would have us place eudaimonia as flourishing at the heart of ethics. Swanton would have us understand eudaimonia as flourishing but reduce its role in moral theory. What this dichotomy overlooks is another possibility: to understand eudaimonia differently and place it at the center. It is this: to live well is not necessarily to flourish but to live a life that best expresses the important things in life in the way that they are as a matter of fact important to us. Whether such a life will be conflicted or not must be settled by an empirical, naturalistic inquiry about the deepest aspects of the nature of our psychology. Aristotle thought that if we lived well in the expressivist sense, then we would flourish in the psychological sense. Swanton is right to insist that we should not accept flourishing as an essential feature of the structure of virtue ethics. But she is wrong to think that we can weaken the naturalist requirement to a mere constraint.

Once character is put at the center of moral theory, its study must issue from reliable methods of inquiry. Those methods are largely empirical, and they must address two key issues: the natural process that gives us our natures and the actual results of that process. Aristotle was wrong about the process whereby we get our natures, and Darwin was right. We get our natures (our genotypic and phenotypic psychological traits) from the processes of evolution. Some traits have adaptive explanations; some do not. But all come from the vicissitudes of evolution. There is nothing about that process that guarantees that we will have a set of psychological traits that properly nurtured will be unconflicted. The process whereby we get our natures has a very limited interest in our happiness or our psychological flourishing. If reproduction is best achieved by psychopathic character traits, then the process whereby we get our natures is as open to that possibility as one that will make us contented cows. Any moral psychology associated with virtue ethics must recognize this fact and cannot rely on any articles of faith or postulates of practical reason about the ultimate reconciliation of morality and flourishing. To do so is to abandon the commitment to reliable methods of inquiry about what virtue ethics puts at the center of moral theory. But to suggest that naturalism only constrains what morality requires of us is to suggest that morality has some foundation outside our nature the demands of which must accommodate our frailties.

One final point. Swanton says that what makes a right act right is that it satisfies the demands of the world as she understands that concept. The point is that justification proceeds from the demands of the world. But if this is true, then the normative account of right action is not virtue-derivative in the sense that Swanton and some other virtue ethicists have asserted. I believe that virtue ethicists should give up the attempt to provide an account of justification that rests ultimately on virtue. What they should retain that would be sufficient to distinguish a plausible virtue ethics from other kinds of moral theory is the claim that the best explanation for why we see the demands of the world in the way that we do is to be found in our developed nature, in our character.