Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy

Placeholder book cover

Bryan Van Norden, Virtue Ethics and Consequentialism in Early Chinese Philosophy, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 412pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521867351.

Reviewed by Chenyang Li, Central Washington University


In this impressive book Bryan Van Norden examines the moral philosophy of Kongzi (Confucius) and Mengzi (Mencius) under the framework of virtue ethics and the philosophy of early Mohists under the framework of consequentialism. The book contains five chapters. The first chapter discusses methodological and conceptual issues, serving as a good gateway into the main body of the book. The author adopts an analytic approach, which is chiefly concerned with "finding, interpreting, and evaluating arguments in the texts; clarifying the meaning of the texts by spelling out interpretive alternatives and examining whether some make better sense of the text than others; and exploring whether each text is self-consistent" (2). The analytic approach has gained considerable ground in Chinese philosophy in the last decade. This book is yet another good demonstration of it. In interpreting ancient texts, Van Norden employs a "hermeneutic of restoration," an approach based on the belief that the text's author does not intentionally lie about what she believes. This approach is opposed to a "hermeneutic of suspicion," which attempts to find ulterior motives for the composition of the text that are unrelated to any justification of the truth claims made in the text. Van Norden also makes a clear and strong justification for his use of "virtue ethics" in interpreting Ruism (Confucianism). He understands "virtue ethics" as comprising four components: (1) an account of what a "flourishing" human life is, (2) an account of what virtues contribute to leading such a life, (3) an account of how one acquires those virtues, and (4) a philosophical anthropology that explains what humans are like, so that they can acquire the virtues that will enable them to flourish in that kind of life (33-34). According to this understanding, Ruism is unquestionably a virtue ethics, even though it offers conceptions of these aspects different from Aristotelian virtue ethics. This chapter is extraordinary; few writers on Chinese philosophy have laid out a methodology with the kind of conceptual clarity and philosophical depth that Van Norden provides here.

In Chapter 2, on Kongzi and Ruism, Van Norden examines key concepts and some major issues in the Analects. He makes a sustained, even if not decisive, argument that Passage 4.15 on dutifulness and reciprocity does not fit well with the rest of the Analects and is an interpolation. Passage 4.15 has been controversial for students of the Analects. If this passage is indeed an interpolation, it will save a lot of headaches in the future. Van Norden also argues, quite convincingly in my opinion, that the doctrine of "correcting names" (zheng ming), as important as it may be, is not central to Kongzi's general philosophy (which centers on the ideal of ren). "Correcting names" is a central piece of Kongzi's political philosophy, but not of his philosophy in general. Failing to make this distinction leads to a distortion of Kongzi's entire philosophy.

Chapter 3 is on Mozi and early Mohism. In addition to a careful examination of Mohism as a consequentialist philosophy, Van Norden launches a comprehensive study of the Mohist idea of "jian ai," which the author aptly renders as "impartial caring." Van Norden does not merely comment on and evaluate the Mohist ideal of "impartial caring" in general terms; he focuses on a few specific arguments:  the caretaker argument, the ruler argument, the historical precedent argument, the filial piety argument, and the practicality argument. He concludes that the Ruist view of graded love is more justified than the Mohist notion of impartial caring. Van Norden, however, seems to have left out the most important Mohist argument, that from the overall benefit of impartial caring to society and the overall harm caused by doing the opposite (which Mozi elaborates in the Chapter of Impartial Caring of the Mozi).

In Chapter 4, on Mengzi, Van Norden mainly focuses on Mengzi's account of  "xing" or human nature, and Mengzi's disagreement with Yang Zhu, Gaozi, and Xunzi. The author offers an interesting analysis of Yang Zhu, concluding that Yang Zhu's philosophy is probably a form of "privatism," a view that "one should act only for the interest of oneself and one's immediate family" (209). While this is an interesting idea, it is more speculative than based on textual evidence. Van Norden also provides a fairly thorough examination of Mengzi's and Xunzi's views on "xing" or human nature. He writes,

Mengzi held that human nature was good, and by this he meant that humans have innate tendencies toward virtue that will develop given a healthy environment and ethical cultivation. Xunzi held that human nature was bad, and by this he meant that the innate dispositions that we have prior to enculturation are almost purely self-interested, and if humans follow them they will be led to mutual destruction. (203)

This is an accurate summary of the two philosophers' views on human nature, despite Van Norden's assertion that Mengzi and Xunzi do not share even "a thin conception of xing" (202).

The final chapter begins with a brief summary of previous chapters before it turns to assess the weaknesses of Ruism and its remedies. This includes moving from ethical monism to ethical pluralism, overcoming sexism, changing from epistemological optimism to fallibilism, and incorporating procedural justice. In all these aspects, Ruism has to learn from the heritage of the Western Enlightenment. In the meantime, Ruism also has some valuable things to offer the West. Van Norden concludes the chapter with an outline of the possible contributions of a neo-Mengzian virtue ethics. Many will find immediately objectionable Van Norden's characterization of neo-Confucianism as "Confucianism seen through Buddhist lenses" (316). I, however, think he is largely on the mark. As far as its core moral philosophy is concerned, neo-Confucianism represents a significant departure from classic Confucianism.

Van Norden is to be commended for building his study solidly on the achievements of previous scholars, making a fruitful use of scholarly works by such authors as Graham, Nivison, Kupperman, Ivanhoe, and Shun. As such, this book not only gives readers new insights by the author but also provides a good overview of issues that have been treated by other scholars. The author aims to produce a work that is accessible to Sinologists with a limited knowledge of philosophy as well as to philosophers with a limited knowledge of Chinese culture. That is, of course, a daunting task because the flip side of such an attempt, almost by necessity, is to produce a work that is at times too rudimentary for people of either side. Given the difficulties involved in such an ambitious undertaking, Van Norden has done a remarkable job.

There are a number of issues raised by this book that are worth further examination. First of all, while recognizing that the notion of "ren" has a narrow and a broad meaning in the Analects, both in the sense of humaneness and as a comprehensive virtue that encompasses all other virtues, Van Norden nevertheless translates it as "humaneness" and "benevolence." This is unfortunate because it obscures some of Kongzi's teachings and impedes the author's otherwise excellent effort at expounding Kongzi's philosophy. For instance, in the Analects, after Kongzi praises Minister Ziwen for being dutiful, Zizhang asks whether Ziwen is "ren," and Kongzi responds, "I do not know about that -- what makes you think he deserves to be called humane?" (77). Here "ren" should be read in the broader sense to mean the all-encompassing virtue. Consider that earlier in the same chapter of the Analects, Kongzi is asked whether he thinks his disciples Zilu, Ran Qiu, and Gongxichi are "ren," and in each case Kongzi replies that he does not know (5.8). If "ren" means being humane, we would expect Kongzi to know if these disciples are humane (in the narrow sense used in the book) or not. Rendering the word as "humane" does not illuminate the passage. Moreover, Van Norden writes, "Zhu Xi argues explicitly that all virtues are, ultimately, manifestations of benevolence" (43). Here again, rendering "ren" as "benevolence" does not capture its meaning as an all-encompassing virtue. "Human Excellence," although not ideal, would be a better alternative for it.

Second, some of Van Norden's translations are problematic. For example, he interprets Analects 12.3 as follows: When Simaniu asks about "ren" -- which Van Norden again translated as "humane" -- "Kongzi replies, 'The humane person is hesitant to speak.' 'Hesitant to speak -- is that all there is to humaneness?' [Kongzi said,] 'When being humane is so difficult, how can one not be hesitant to speak about it?'" (81). The original sentence does not explicitly say that "being humane [ren]" is difficult; it is Van Norden's interpretive insertion (he is not the first one to do so). But there are good reasons to resist this creative interpretation. First, Kongzi's reply is simply that the person of ren is hesitant to speak. Even in his elaboration, Kongzi did not explicitly say that the person of ren is hesitant to speak about ren. Second, Kongzi's point that the person of ren is not too quick to speak is consistent with other passages such as 13.13, 1.3, and 17.17 in the Analects. Third, Simaniu, according to the Records of History (Shi Ji), is "duo yan er zao," namely too talkative and impatient. Given that Kongzi often tailors his instructions specifically to suit the type of person under his instruction, it makes sense that here Kongzi wishes Simaniu to be cautious as he speaks, in general. In Van Norden's interpretation, this aspect of Kongzi's teaching is lost.  D. C. Lau's translation of the last sentence is more faithful to the original: "The Master said, 'When to act is difficult, is it any wonder that one is loath to speak?'" Lau noted that this is "for fear that one may be unable to live up to one's words. Cf. 4.22, 4.24" (Confucius: The Analects, trans. D. C. Lau, New York: Penguin Classics, 1979, 112).

Furthermore, Van Norden's interpretation of "wu" as "xiu" (258) is also questionable, to say the least. "Xiu" or shame is a painful feeling caused by a sense of guilt, embarrassment, disgrace, or unworthiness. "Wu," on the other hand, does not involve such a sense even though both "xiu" and "wu" involve a negative attitude toward oneself or others. The ancient Chinese lexicon Shuowenjiezi uses "wu" to define "zeng," i.e., detest. According to the lexicon, "wu" (originally) means "guo," namely fault. The lexicon's classical commenter Duan Yucai (1735-1815) explains that "when someone is at fault is called wu; detesting the fault is also called wu." "Wu" simply does not have the same meaning as "xiu," as Van Norden insists it does.

Fourth, in Chapter 4 Van Norden writes that "I think [Harold] Roth is correct in arguing that the goal of Mengzian cultivation is completely at odds with the goal of meditative practice as suggested by the 'Inward Training' and other texts that were later classified as 'Daoist'" (233). If by this he means that the "Inward Training" (Neiye) Chapter of the Guanzi is a Doaist text, I think he is too quick in drawing this conclusion. It is arguable that the "Inward Training" Chapter is a mix of Daoist and Ruist philosophy as it also promotes ideas that are clearly Ruist, such as "jie yue mo ruo li" (nothing is better in regulating music than li), "shou li mo ruo jing" (nothing is a better way to follow li than being respectful), and "tian ren di yi" (the ren of Heaven and the rightness of Earth).

Finally, even a meticulous writer like Van Norden can be sloppy. For instance, he writes, "Direct reference theories are designed to explain how speakers of the same language can attach different 'senses' to the same word yet refer to the same thing. (See Kripke, Naming and Necessity.)" (18). For Saul Kripke, rigid designators like proper names and natural kind terms make direct reference by directly "fixing the reference," but they simply do not have any "senses" at all.

Despite these concerns, Van Norden is to be congratulated for producing such a superb work. I highly recommend it to anyone interested in Chinese philosophy and Chinese-Western comparative philosophy.