Virtue, Happiness, Knowledge: Themes from the Work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin

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David O. Brink, Susan Sauvé Meyer, and Christopher Shields (eds.), Virtue, Happiness, Knowledge: Themes from the Work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin, Oxford University Press, 2018, 318pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198817277.

Reviewed by Iakovos Vasiliou The Graduate Center, City University of New York


Anyone who has done even rudimentary research in the history of western philosophy must have come across the work of Gail Fine and Terence Irwin. While best known for their books and essays on ancient philosophy, each of them has published significant work on figures from various periods over their prolific careers. Stemming originally from a conference at Cornell University in 2013, this volume is a Festschrift marking their retirements from the University of Oxford and from Cornell. Edited by three former students, the collection consists of the editors' Introduction and fifteen chapters by former students and close colleagues of Gail and Terry (as they are known and referred to throughout the volume), concluding with complete bibliographies of the honorees up to 2016. The essays (including one by each of the editors) are written by senior or very senior philosophers, almost all of whom will be familiar to readers.

There are some remarkable aspects to the volume as a whole. First, I cannot recall (although I have not specifically researched this) a Festschrift being dedicated to two people. Yet with the exception of a joint translation of selected texts of Aristotle, Irwin and Fine have each published their own body of work independently. The result is that the volume celebrates two individual philosophers; this might lead one to wonder why they would be honored together, especially since, despite their both being dominant figures in ancient philosophy, Fine's work and influence is primarily in the areas of metaphysics and epistemology, while Irwin's is primarily in ethics. Two explanations emerge from the Introduction: first, their joint influence as teachers over many decades (disclosure: I myself took several courses with each of them as an undergraduate at Cornell in the 1980's; Terry was also my undergraduate thesis advisor); and, second, their shared methodology. I note as well that a third explanation for the joint celebration might be the well-known fact that they are life-partners, which the editors do not mention. Perhaps they (as well as the honorees) thought that that fact does not strictly constitute a reason for their being honored together. Nevertheless, it also seems likely that it is part of the explanation, at least in the mundane sense of their being at the same institutions throughout their careers, enabling them together to foster and interact with generations of students and colleagues.

The Introduction highlights Fine's and Irwin's attachment to a shared methodology:

they practice an unremitting philosophical form of history of philosophy, or, judged from another angle, a historically enriched form of systematic philosophy. That is, as they pursue it, philosophy engages the discipline's history in a manner animated by its current and perennial concerns, but it does so while remaining fully sensitive to the original context of its production. Their work combines the highest level of scholarly rigor and rich philosophical insight. Animated by a purely philosophical spirit, it is never narrowly antiquarian in orientation. . . . their work never loses sight of a simple question: should we too believe this? (1)

This is a powerful and compelling approach, but one that readers of NDPR know is not without significant controversy. The "simple" question is, of course, not simple at all and more "antiquarian" scholars would question not only its simplicity, but even its usefulness and appropriateness to history of philosophy. To ask, "should we too believe this?" is, according to the antiquarian, rather hubristic. It is difficult and controversial enough simply to figure out what Plato's view is, and what his arguments and reasons for it are. To go on and try to assess in our own terms the value of Plato's contributions to, say, epistemology would require that we readers be not only Platonic scholars, but contemporary epistemologists as well.

But as the passage above states, Irwin and Fine's work unremittingly rejects such a conservative approach: they insist on both interpreting the arguments and assessing their merits in the context of current philosophical debate. Indeed, in defending this approach against the charge of anachronism, the editors point out that one can only very rarely get the correct interpretation of a text without at the same time assessing a philosopher's motivations and objectives; given the variety of possible interpretations of a philosophical text, we must choose among them. But how do we choose?

Gail's way of choosing begins by determining, with all due charity and intellectual humility, which of the alternatives is best supported by the argument the author of the text promulgates. Where no immediate argument is given, one may equally determine, as her approach suggests, which among the positions most readily comports with claims motivated by argument elsewhere. (3, my emphasis)

(Although the editors are specifically speaking about Fine's methodology, given what was said earlier in the Introduction, it should be taken to apply to Irwin as well.) One area of contention concerns the italicized passage. The antiquarian would argue that one is never in a position to deploy adequate charity to make such a trans-historical assessment; any interpretation that attempts such a move in fact does not employ "due intellectual humility" but instead risks intellectual arrogance. In favor of the Fine/Irwin method, however, one could counter that it is an appropriately philosophical approach to philosophical texts: how could one even go about assessing what is a charitable interpretation without at least some provisional sense, supported in turn by argument, of what is going to count as a better or worse philosophical argument on the matter at hand? And this question must be answered, as best we can, by our own, reflective philosophical lights. How else could we answer it?

This is a serious and substantive issue that has significant repercussions for how we understand philosophy and its relationship to its history. Much of Fine's and Irwin's careers occurred at a time when ancient philosophy was bursting onto the philosophical scene through the work of earlier generations of philosophers, including G.E.M. Anscombe, Gilbert Ryle, Gregory Vlastos, G.E.L. Owen, and Harold Cherniss. Instead of being a marginalized field (from the perspective of philosophy departments), whose primary practitioners were classicists, ancient philosophy became a serious and respectable part of philosophy departments, worthy of attention from philosophers. Of course, Fine and Irwin, sharpening an approach to ancient philosophy inherited from Owen and Vlastos, were at the forefront of those who put the ancients in direct dialogue with and subject to evaluation by contemporary philosophical standards and positions.

But in the last couple of decades the sort of systematic philosophical history practiced by Irwin and Fine has lost some ground, as history of philosophy once again seems to many to be a scholarly, historical pursuit conducted independently of the work of contemporary philosophers, though of course this approach has continued to be practiced.

So, the argument over methodology continues. But since this issue directly affects the legacy of the work of Irwin and Fine as well as our own understanding of philosophy and its relationship to its history, it is perhaps regrettable that more attention is not paid to it beyond the editors' rather brief remarks. The "critics" who charge anachronism are not named or footnoted, let alone included in the volume. As the editors themselves say, "she [Fine] does not spend a great deal of time overtly defending or even describing her philosophical method. Still, the same method structures her work in virtually every period of her long and productive career." (3). We might note, however, that there are some insightful remarks in Irwin's Development of Ethics, v.1, §§6-7 that describe and defend his approach to the history of ethics, explicitly against a "Cantabrigian" history (10), which has some elements in common with the "antiquarian" approach sketched here. Importantly, Irwin does not see his approach and the more "antiquarian" one as necessarily in conflict. In any case, given that Fine and Irwin are admired for their rigorous application of reason and argument in support of their interpretations and against the interpretations of their opponents, it would have been rewarding if this volume had included more engagement with other approaches and some direct defense of the central methodology that underlies their work.

All of the fifteen essays, however, either explicitly endorse or else simply assume the method and proceed accordingly. While this is not meant as a critique of the results, I think it contributes to what might appear to be the book's insular nature. Moreover, it is striking that unlike other philosophical Festschrifts where the honoree is "honored" in that distinctive philosophical way, with essays that are sometimes sharply critical of the views of the person being honored, that is not so here. With one exception, none of the papers engages critically with the substantive positions of either Fine or Irwin. It might have been an appropriate and welcome homage to them to include at least some who oppose them, both on substantive issues of interpretation as well as on broader methodological grounds.

I face the difficulty of treating fifteen essays that, other than sharing Fine and Irwin's methodology, have little in common in terms of historical period, figure, or philosophical area. Space precludes a substantive engagement with the specific essays, so, after a few general remarks on the collection overall, I will simply give a brief summary of each essay, sometimes adding a dogmatic critical comment.

The first six essays focus on Plato, the next five on Aristotle, with the last four addressing broader historical or contemporary topics. Overall the essays are of high quality, although some are significantly more engaging than others. They reflect at once the range of interests of Fine and Irwin but also how difficult it is to do the sort of "philosophical form of history of philosophy" so well exemplified in their work. Some of the essays -- such as Brown's, Meyer's, Shields's, Charles's, Nielsen's, and to some extent Annas's -- delve deeply into textual and philological details, of interest primarily to specialists in ancient philosophy, but one can at times lose the sense of the philosophical significance of the argument. Others -- such as Kraut's, Gottlieb's, and at points Annas's and Brink's -- avoid getting bogged down in textual details but may move too quickly over complex philosophical terrain.

Lesley Brown's "Rethinking Agreement in Plato" focuses on the meaning of the word homologein, typically translated as "to agree". Brown claims that while A's asking B whether B agrees that p suggests that A herself believes that p, this does not fit many instances of homologein in Plato; sometimes homologein simply means to declare or to state publicly. Socrates's asking whether an interlocutor agrees with a claim should not be taken to imply that Socrates himself endorses the claim. Brown offers examples of the harm done by such inferences, but I am not convinced that the damage is so severe. Nevertheless, the philological point about the meaning of homologein is persuasive.

Ralph Wedgwood's, "Plato's Theory of Knowledge," is the essay that most critically engages the views of one of the honorees. He begins by explicitly endorsing Fine's methodology (34); but then later specifically addresses her arguments against the Two Worlds Theory. Wedgwood defends the idea that Plato is a contextualist about knowledge, which, for Wedgwood, amounts to the idea that he may use the same cognitive terms to refer to different cognitive states in different contexts. He claims that this makes certain problems "easy" (54), such as how to interpret Socrates's claim that he has doxa but not epistēmē of the Form of the Good: doxa is being used in the "broad sense" to refer to the genus consisting of the four specific cognitive states of the Line, while epistēmē is being used in the "narrow sense" to refer to the highest cognitive state (noēsis). One might wonder, however, whether this makes some problems too easy. Interestingly, it seems that Wedgwood ends up arguing not so much in support of the Two Worlds Theory as Fine understands (and rejects) it, but rather reinterprets what the Two Worlds Theory itself maintains.

In "Justice and Persuasion in the Republic," Dominic Scott elaborates on themes from his Levels of Argument (OUP 2015). He highlights the "shorter" (435c-d) and "longer" (504a-e) routes mentioned in the Republic. The former, primarily employed in Books 4, 8 and 9, informs us that a just soul is a sort of health or harmony. The latter would be the route described in Books 5-7, namely the one pursued by philosophers who actually ascend to the Form of the Good. Scott maintains, however, that what we in fact find in Books 5-7 is a "middle route" that helps us to understand why philosophers should rule, without actually deepening our understanding of justice. For most readers of the Republic there would be no point to a middle route for the ethical argument about the superiority of justice, but there is for a political argument justifying rule by philosophers.

Richard Kraut ("Plato Against Democracy: A Defense") argues that Plato's criticisms of democracy in the Republic, based fundamentally on the notion that ruling is a position that a person ought to be qualified to occupy, are ones that contemporary political theorists ought to take seriously. Essentially he challenges the idea that anyone regardless of qualification has a right to vote (and to run for office). Kraut proffers a thought experiment, the "New Kallipolis", in which everyone instead has the right to (try to?) become qualified to participate in political life. Among several political, ethical, and pragmatic objections to such a proposal, perhaps the most obvious, which Kraut never directly considers, is the claim that a human being qua human being has a fundamental right to a say in how they are governed, and that to deprive them of this would in itself be unethical.

In "Self-Mastery and Self-Rule in Plato's Laws", Susan Sauvé Meyer explains that central to the opening two books of the Laws is a tension between a conflict model of virtue (where one aspect of our psychology, our calculation or reasoning, is victorious over the others) and a harmony model of virtue (where our various psychological impulses and beliefs are in harmony). While the Athenian explicitly gains endorsement for the harmony model, he never (in Laws 1) applies it to the case of the individual, but only to a family or city. Elaborating and supplementing an argument from her translation and commentary on Laws 1 and 2, Meyer holds that the Athenian continues via the puppet image to present the conflict model of virtue, long after he has established the superiority of the harmony model (108), appealing to ideas that he himself does not accept as part of his overall dialectical strategy.

Verity Harte's "Plato's Philebus and the Value of Idle Pleasure" focuses on what Sidgwick calls the "paradox of hedonism", according to which one does not achieve (the most, best) pleasure by making pleasure the intended goal of one's activity. In particular, the pleasure of virtue can only be attained if the intended goal is not pleasure; Harte dubs this sort of pleasure "idle". In the Philebus, Harte argues, the only true, pure pleasures -- the ones that make a contribution to the good life -- turn out to be idle ones. Moreover, their idleness is a prerequisite of their goodness, for idle pleasures are not aimed at by the subject but result from the pursuit of a distinct end, such as knowledge. One of the strongest articles in the collection, the essay is also carefully written so as to be accessible and of interest to the non-specialist in ancient philosophy.

Christopher Shield's "A Series of Goods", the first article on Aristotle, has a narrower appeal. It focuses on a very short sketch of an argument in Nicomachean Ethics I.6 against the Platonist Form of the Good. Shields provides a series of detailed and speculative (as he himself admits, 146) elaborations of the text, expanding it from its initial three steps to eleven, and then finally back down to ten. One might be forgiven for being somewhat disappointed, after assessing the merits of various reconstructions (by Shields and others), to discover in the final few pages that after all the argument is best understood as a close relative of the famous and familiar Third Man Argument from the Parmenides.

In "Practical Truth: An Interpretation of Parts of Nicomachean Ethics VI", David Charles argues for a "third way" of understanding Aristotle's idea that what grasps practical truth is desiderative understanding or intellectual desire. The primary idea is that the intellectual and desiderative are not separable components as "two-component" interpreters hold. Rather, Charles's third way accepts that practical thoughts (e.g. that x is to be done) are true (or false), like beliefs, but does not understand such a thought as separable in definition from the desire to do x; likewise, such desires are not separable from practical thoughts. This is of central importance for understanding Aristotle's conception of phronēsis and his moral psychology, although all of the ramifications are not spelled out here. The essay is persuasive and provocative; it should generate considerable discussion by specialists.

Paula Gottlieb's short "Aristotelian Feelings in the Rhetoric" maintains that the discussion of feelings in the Rhetoric "provides various insights" that are relevant to ethics; this is reasonable enough, but it leaves the details rather vague, awaiting a fuller account of Aristotelian moral development. She includes a brief comparison with Hobbes, the motivation for which was difficult to determine given her conclusion that while superficially similar to Aristotle's, Hobbes view of feelings is actually quite different.

In another short paper, "'Ought' in Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics," Julia Annas studies the uses of dei and chrē and associated gerundives that generally appear to suggest a notion of deontic duty. Scholars have defended extreme views according to which there is no notion of duty at all in Aristotle, only the notion of what one "should" do as tied to achieving some good, or else that there is a strong deontic notion, very widely applied to every putative virtuous action. Annas opts for a more moderate position, but in its brevity the paper is more suggestive than conclusive. Annas holds that Aristotle, without explicitly analysing any deontic notion, uses deontic notions in tandem with the notion of the fine, so that neither a deontic approach nor the virtuous person's aiming at the fine has priority over the other. According to her, Aristotle's deontic "notions" are weaker than obligation or duty (195). But then she immediately points out that virtue can, after all, have the force of duty, for example when courage requires that one defend one's city, adding: "This is an under-explored area to which I hope to return."

Karen Margrethe Nielsen's "Deliberation and Decision in the Magna Moralia and Eudemian Ethics" is an interesting, persuasive, and scholarly paper, based on a seminar co-taught with Irwin. She argues that if we pay attention to the accounts of deliberation and decision (prohairesis) in the MM and EE it makes little sense to think of the MM as written by a student or follower of Aristotle, who, rather ineptly, is trying to capture or summarize some of the views in the EE. More plausibly, the MM is an adolescent first draft by Aristotle where he has yet to develop the more mature ethical positions of the EE and NE. The philosophical heart of the paper is the argument that in the EE Aristotle adopts a teleological account of prohairesis, according to which one decides to do x for the sake of y rather than more common "preferential" interpretations of prohairesis, according to which we decide to do x instead of y. The paper includes some fairly detailed discussion of manuscript variations and will be of interest to specialists in Aristotle's ethics.

In "The Freedom Required for Moral Responsibility," John Martin Fischer begins with an account of moral responsibility from Irwin's "Reason and Responsibility in Aristotle" (1980). In response to Frankfurt-style cases, Fischer proceeds to describe his "reasons-responsiveness" view of moral responsibility. Much of the paper then defends Fischer's view (developed in publications over the past thirty years or so) against a variety of recent criticisms that have been levied against it by Christopher Franklin, Michael McKenna, and also those whom Fisher dubs "the new dispositionalists", such as Michael Fara and Michael Smith.

Allen Wood's, "Virtue: Aristotle and Kant," provides a useful and illuminating summary of differences between Aristotle and Kant on virtue, arguing (in a way that is now more familiar due to past work on Aristotle and Kant by Irwin and Wood himself) that they are not as far apart as older "traditional" accounts would have it. The real disagreement between them, according to Wood, concerns the structure of practical reason (248). In the end, Aristotelian ethics and ancient eudaimonism in general are too optimistic about human nature in its belief that moral progress could be a "process of natural growth"; so the ancient standpoint does not adequately appreciate the human condition, which, Wood suggests, Kant displays a better grasp of at least in his philosophical anthropology and philosophy of history, if not in his more famous ethical works. I wish that Wood had more directly engaged with Irwin's arguments in the Development of Ethics about how Aristotle's and Kant's ethical views might be brought closer together. Irwin's and Wood's views seem to me to have much in common, despite some profound differences in their conclusions.

Chapter 14 contains a clear and useful discussion by Roger Crisp of Richard Prices's views on virtue, stemming from a seminar taught with Irwin, comparing them specifically with Aristotelian, Kantian, and utilitarian perspectives. Price's views, which may not be well known to the volume's average reader, are interesting but quite implausible on several fronts, as Crisp himself carefully shows (263-268). Some of the implausibility of Price's views appears to stem from certain of his theological commitments, which seemed to me an opportunity to reflect on how the Irwin/Fine methodology handles such positions and texts, where the answer to the "simple" question, "should we too believe this?", seems to be obviously, "no".

The final chapter, David Brink's "Eudaimonism and Cosmopolitan Concern," argues that Aristotle has the resources to defend a "mixed cosmopolitanism" within his eudaimonist framework. Whereas "pure" cosmopolitanism holds that one has some duties to all people and that one's duties to those people are of equal weight, mixed cosmopolitanism holds that while duties to others have universal scope, they do not necessarily have equal weight. Such a position, Brink argues, can be justified within a eudaimonist framework by appeal to genuine self-love of the sort employed in Aristotle's account of friendship. Brink's view seems to me quite close to Irwin's in Development of Ethics, although there is no substantive discussion of that work.

I hope the preceding has given a sense of the scope and interest of this volume, which should appeal to many philosophers across a wide range of specialties. The editors have produced an excellent and fitting volume to honor the careers of two of the most distinguished philosophical historians alive today.


I thank Brad Inwood for helpful comments on an earlier draft.