Virtue, Norms, and Objectivity: Issues in Ancient and Modern Ethics

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Christopher Gill (ed.), Virtue, Norms, and Objectivity: Issues in Ancient and Modern Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2005, 344pp, $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199264384.

Reviewed by Chris Bobonich, Stanford University


This is a collection of 13 papers (along with an introductory essay by the editor) mostly on issues surrounding the objectivity and grounding of ethical norms and virtues in ancient Greek philosophy along with a few papers more concerned with the structure and content of particular Greek ethical theories. They stem from a 2002 conference at the University of Exeter and, despite some overlap, are a somewhat heterogeneous lot. The papers by the Anglo-American contributors concentrate mainly on Plato and Aristotle, although Nancy Sherman focuses on the Stoic, Seneca, and R.W. Sharples has a welcome essay on the Aristotelian commentator, Alexander of Aphrodisias (c. 200CE). The papers by the two German contributors, Wolfgang Detel and Ludwig Siep, range much more broadly over ethics and metaethics, including modern and contemporary theories.

In "In what Sense are Ancient Ethical Norms Universal?", Christopher Gill usefully examines the role that the notion of universality plays in ancient ethics. He distinguishes two kinds of universality: having to do with (a) the abstractness or generality of ethical concepts and principles, and (b) the links between ethical concepts and principles and universal or fundamental features of reality. He draws upon these distinctions to sketch three levels of universality in ancient ethical understanding: (1) thoughts about what features, e.g., brave actions typically have, (2) a more reflective understanding of how these judgments fit together into an ethical theory and their connections with psychology, and (3) thinking about how reality underpins these concepts and theories. It might have been useful to distinguish a little more sharply among the following four things.

(i) Ethical particularism/ethical generalism. This controversy can be characterized in several ways, for example, whether there are justifiable ethical principles, or whether good ethical reasoning involves the use of principles or whether it is the case that one can work out in a principled way starting from how an ethical consideration is relevant in one case to how that same consideration should affect our ethical judgment in other cases.

(ii) The scope of ethical judgments: Do my ethical judgments apply only to my tribe or my fellow-citizens, or to all human beings, or, perhaps, to all rational or sentient creatures as such? (And note that even if ethical judgments do not apply to a certain group in the sense that the members of the group are not bound by them or they do not function as reasons for them, this does not entail that ethical judgments should not take, e.g., the interests or welfare of that group into account. One might think, for example, that ethical judgments do not apply in this sense to various non-human animals, but also hold that ethical judgments need to take the welfare of animals into account.)

(iii) Impartiality: Characteristically, modern moral theories require the agent to be impartial in some way, but this idea finds very different expression, e.g., in consequentialism and Kantianism.

(iv) Objectivity: e.g., the idea that ethical claims are made true by mind-independent features of reality.

It is not at all clear what the relations among these different ideas are, but it seems worth noting that it is at least not obvious that universalism about (ii), e.g., thinking ethical judgments apply to humans as such entails universalism in the sense of ethical generalism (i).

In a fascinating essay, Sarah Broadie examines the notion of the summum bonum or highest good that is central to ancient ethical thought, but has fallen, Broadie believes, out of favor in the past 150 years. Broadie, rightly I think, holds that the highest good is characterized in relation to other goods, not directly in terms of the right or the morally right. She distinguishes two interpretations of it: (1) Eudoxus' view that pleasure is the highest good because if pleasure is added to anything, it makes that thing better, and (2) the idea found in Plato and Aristotle that the highest good is the source of value for other goods insofar as it makes these other goods good. Broadie worries that Eudoxus' conception allows for ties for the highest good and that ancient theory disallows this. But there is perhaps a more straightforward worry. Even if when added to anything, X makes it better, X might only make it marginally better and so one might think that X is a trivial good. (Everything might be better with ketchup, but only trivially so). Broadie understandably brackets the issues of the relation between (1) and (2) and the Aristotelian notion of the highest good as that for the sake of which we choose all other goods, but working this out would be of considerable interest.

Nancy Sherman's essay is innovative, although not especially tightly tied to main issues of the volume. Sherman focuses on Seneca's De Beneficiis (usually translated as On Benefits, but Sherman suggests On Doing Kindnesses) and argues that Seneca holds that an essential part of the cultivation of a virtue such as kindness is a cultivation of an "aesthetic of character, " that is, the cultivation of certain emotional manners and demeanors.

As I noted, the papers by Detel and Siep are less concerned with particular ancient texts or authors. Siep focuses on the challenges provided by cultural change and cultural relativism to notions of the virtues and their objectivity. He argues, as do several contemporary virtue-ethics theorists, that a commonality in human nature over time and across cultures allows us to justify certain virtues. More controversially, he thinks that the justification of value judgments by "public (historical) experience, and philosophical justification" (p. 97) will allow us to reject Mackie-like projectivist accounts of the nature of values, although it remained somewhat unclear exactly how this was to work. Detel, after a brief discussion of different kinds of normativity in Plato, spends most his time discussing modern normative semantics, including Brandom, Davidson, and Dretske. I did not find it easy to see the relation between this latter discussion and ancient ethical theories or even modern notions of normativity in ethics. Gill appends his own explication of Detel from a Stoic point of view.

Terry Penner continues here elaborating his interpretation of the ethics of the early or Socratic Platonic dialogues. On Penner's interpretation, Socrates is an egoist who holds that each person seeks to maximize his own good or maximally realize his own happiness within his own life. Virtue is knowledge of the agent's own good understood as knowledge of how to choose the best means to maximal happiness. An unfortunate consequence of this interpretation is that on it, it is neither the case that virtue is necessary for happiness (one of Plato's most characteristic ethical theses) nor that other goods are dependent on virtue or knowledge of the good for their goodness as Plato holds in the Euthydemus and the Meno. The problem is the same in both cases: an agent might enjoy the good even without knowledge if he has good luck or merely follows the directions of a knowledgeable person.[1] M.M. McCabe in her article, more plausibly, I think, suggests that we look to a tighter connection between the agent's knowledge and the goodness of his choices.

An equally contentious part of Penner's typical interpretation is that Plato of the early dialogues has a philosophy of language according to which I desire to do an action if and only if that action actually maximizes my happiness. A longstanding objection to this interpretation is that we are unable to explain why the person performed the mistaken action (e.g., why I drink this glass of liquid that I falsely believe is healthful and not turpentine) without invoking a desire to perform that action. Penner here develops a sketch of an intended answer to the objection. He explains, if I have managed to understand him correctly, the person's mistaken action by attributing to him an "incoherent" desire. When I desire, e.g., to drink this glass of liquid that I falsely believe is healthful and not turpentine, what I desire is to drink this glass of liquid with the consequence of drinking a glass of healthful water. But there is no such action and so my desire is "incoherent" (pp. 167-8). Indeed, it seems to be for a non-existent object. Further discussion is needed of how an "incoherent" desire actually explains any action and of the usefulness of invoking such non-existent objects.

In a provocative essay, Christopher Rowe asks "What Difference do Forms make for Platonic Epistemology"? What he is mainly concerned with is Plato's ethical epistemology. Rowe argues that the separation of universals that Aristotle famously attributes to Plato (Meta. 1078b27-32) makes no difference to Plato's ethics or his ethical epistemology. It is certainly true that one might reject transcendent universals and give contemplation a very significant role in a good life, as one might think, the Aristotle of Nicomachean Ethics Book X does. But Rowe raises an important problem and I suspect that understanding the influence of Plato's metaphysics on his ethics requires much more than just taking into account the thesis of separation, but will require, e.g., an analysis of what Plato thinks are the properties that make things good and the ways in which our reason is akin to or instantiates such properties. (Rowe seems to me perhaps a little too skeptical about making sense of the idea of "transcendent" Forms. Even some of those with a taste for desert landscapes in ontology recognize the existence of things outside space and time (e.g., sets) and holding that universals can exist uninstantiated, even if it is a minority opinion among contemporary metaphysicians, is hardly a sign of mysticism.)

The other papers, which are all worth more discussion than I can provide here, are Sabina Lovibond, "Virtue, Nature, and Providence", Timothy Chappell, "'The Good Man is the Measure of All Things': Objectivity without World-Centeredness in Aristotle's Moral Epistemology", A.W. Price, "Aristotelian Virtue and Practical Judgment" and R. W. Sharples, "An Aristotelian Commentator on the Naturalness of Justice."

Over the past 20 years, criticism of modern moral theories and the rise of virtue ethics has renewed interest in ancient Greek ethics and its foundations. This collection may lack a certain unity, but many of the papers raise important issues and will provoke further useful debate.

[1] We seem to find the same view in Terry Penner (1991) "Desire and Power in Socrates: The Argument of Gorgias 466A-468E that Orators and Tyrants Have No Power in the City." Apeiron 24, pp. 147-202, 162-4.