Virtue, Rules, and Justice: Kantian Aspirations

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Thomas E. Hill, Jr., Virtue, Rules, and Justice: Kantian Aspirations, Oxford University Press, 2012, 320pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199692019.

Reviewed by Samuel J. Kerstein, University of Maryland, College Park


One of Hill's main aims is to highlight the relevance to contemporary ethics of Kant's moral philosophy. The book certainly does that. But he also develops Kantian ethics in ways that further contemporary debates, especially in normative ethics.

The book's fifteen chapters, all but one previously published, bring together some of Hill's work over the past decade. With clarity, incisiveness, and sensitivity to current controversies, they touch on issues in metaethics, but they focus mainly on moral and political theory and some of its practical applications. Each chapter is comprehensible to those who do not specialize in Kant. Each is also self-contained, a feature that enables readers easily to gain access to Hill's ideas on the topics that interest them, but that, as Hill acknowledges, results in some repetition of core ideas from chapter to chapter.

After an all-too-brief summary of the book's contents, this review will turn to two of Hill's important projects: an attempt to explain how Kant might account for phenomena associated with weakness of will and an effort to develop a Kantian framework from which to construct concrete moral principles.

Hill divides the book into four parts, with the first, "Basic Themes," beginning with a chapter that crystallizes major ideas in Kant's moral and political philosophy. The next chapter considers competing interpretations by contemporary Kantians of various formulations of the categorical imperative: the formulas of universal law, humanity, autonomy, and the kingdom of ends. The chapter focuses on the interpretations' implications regarding the basis and scope of our duty of beneficence. Hill then turns to "Kantian Constructivism as Normative Ethics," the central question of which is: "What would constructivism be like if it were designed for ethical, not just political questions, if it remained (as far as possible) metaethically noncommittal, and if it drew appropriately from both Kant and Rawls?" (73) Hill distinguishes the Kantian normative constructivism he has in mind from more metaethically ambitious versions, for example, that of Onora O'Neill.

The second main part of the book, "Virtue," begins with a chapter that concerns virtue in the context of our valuing of the natural environment. Hill holds that although values are not properties that we somehow realize would exist in a world devoid of humans, they are also not just created by us, in accordance with our subjective tastes (9, 97-8). Against the background of this view, he develops the idea that "a proper valuing of natural environments is essential to . . . a human virtue that we might call 'appreciation of the good'" (97). He tries to make progress, without metaphysical obscurity or inappropriate anthropomorphism, towards an account of how and why it is good to value certain natural phenomena apart from reasons that derive from human welfare or human rights. This chapter is unique in the book in that it does not mention Kant.

Hill then develops an account (to which we return below) of how phenomena of weakness of will might be understood in the context of Kant's ethics. He also offers an interpretation of Kant's notion of virtue as strength of will to do what is right. Hill contrasts Kant's views with positions associated with contemporary virtue ethics regarding moral rules, sensitivity to context, good motivation, and the standard for right action. Part II of the book ends with a chapter that explores many themes from the second part of Kant's Metaphysics of Morals, the "Doctrine of Virtue." For example, Hill probes Kant's notion of duties to oneself and defends it from some contemporary objections.

The third part of the book, "Moral Rules and Principles," begins with a chapter in which he tries to pinpoint problems with some recent Kantian views (e.g., those of Alan Donagan) regarding what it means to respect the dignity of persons. Hill then sets out as fully as at any other point in the book his distinctive Kantian legislative approach to normative ethics: an account, which we examine in some detail below, according to which we are to arrive at a set of principles governing everyday actions via deliberations guided by prescriptions Hill finds implicit in various formulas of the Categorical Imperative.

In the next two chapters, Hill sets out and defends a Kantian view of moral rules. He argues that a Kantian standard for assessing moral rules is superior to the standard inherent in rule utilitarianism. For example, Hill argues that in contrast to a Kantian, a rule utilitarian would need to embrace the (in Hill's view) implausible idea that we have "no moral freedom to do what we want, even if it harms no one, except insofar as the rules allowing particular freedoms turn out to maximize utility" (213). Moreover, Hill replies to criticisms of a Kantian view of moral rules made by defenders of moral particularism and of virtue ethics. Finally, he describes Kantian strategies for defending basic moral principles. He formulates some arguments Kant made or suggested for the conclusion that all previous moral theories were mistaken. Hill then briefly summarizes some further Kantian strategies for defending fundamental principles, strategies that, according to him, "invite comparison with Rawls's method of reflective equilibrium" (14).

Hill devotes the final part of the book to "Practical Questions," the first set of which concern the permissibility of participating in revolution. Kant's claim that participation in it is always wrong is compatible both with his views that rulers are bound by justice and with his optimism regarding the French revolution, Hill argues. Moreover, he claims, Kant is on solid ground in thinking there cannot be a legal right to revolution. However, he finds Kant to be mistaken in holding that participation in revolution is always immoral. Hill then turns to questions regarding punishment. He examines which practice of punishment we would endorse if reasoning from his Kantian framework for arriving at moral norms. That practice would conflict with some of Kant's official principles of punishment -- a result that calls these principles into question, Hill asserts.

The book's penultimate chapter takes shape against the background of Kant's apparently unyielding opposition to any forcible intervention by one state into the governance of another state. Hill tries to show that Kant's moral philosophy (interpreted in terms of the Kantian constructivist approach Hill advocates) indicates a presumption in favor of humanitarian intervention in some cases. According to Hill, Kant has not provided adequate grounds for an absolute prohibition on such intervention. In the final chapter, Hill investigates from a Kantian perspective the moral responsibilities of bystanders to oppression. He discusses three, all suggested by Kant's later work in ethics: responsibilities to exercise due care in deliberation, to scrutinize the motives one might have for remaining passive, and to try to develop virtue characterized as strength of will. Hill asserts that if we neglect these responsibilities, then, according to a Kantian view, we contribute to the ongoing oppression of others and we fail to respect ourselves,.

One of the many attractive features of the volume is Hill's willingness to address questions that have received surprisingly little attention from Kant experts. One such question is that of how Kant's practical philosophy can account for the possibility of weakness of will. Hill characterizes weakness of will as follows:

All too often we seem to know what we ought to do, care about doing what we ought, and yet do not do it. When criticized, we deny that we acted maliciously, and yet we cannot pretend that we acted in ignorance. We knew what was right and we wanted to do it, we say, but we were weak. (108)

According to this characterization, which, Hill suggests, is both common and intuitively sound (108), weakness of will mitigates blame for wrong action, but is nevertheless a moral defect.

As Hill implies, Kant himself does not make it clear how to account for weakness of will. But Kant has the resources to do so, Hill believes. Central to Hill's position is the idea that in Kant's view (or a charitable reconstruction of it) weak-willed persons have good wills, but lack virtue. A good will amounts to "a sincere commitment and effort to do what is right" (116), says Hill. If one has a good will, then one has "a basic maxim to conform to morality's unconditional requirements" (146). Kant suggests a contrast between those who have good wills and those who have impure wills. Those who have impure wills do not give themselves the fundamental rule to conform to morality's unconditional requirements, but rather a rule to conform to morality's demands except in certain circumstances, for example, except when doing so exacts a price in personal happiness (120). Individuals freely determine whether they have a good or an impure will; the choice is not something that results from the temperament or inclinations a person happens to have, but is rather entirely up to him or her, or so we, as moral agents, must presuppose, according to Kant. In any case, being virtuous requires more than having a good will; it also involves having "a strong and effective will that chooses the right thing even in the presence of contrary inclinations so intense that they might sway a weaker person" (117), says Hill.

As suggested above, weakness of will occurs among those who have good wills, but lack virtue, according to Hill's reconstruction. Those who act wrongly from moral weakness act on a freely chosen maxim that violates the Categorical Imperative (e.g., a maxim of lying to maintain their reputation). Giving in to their inclinations they act contrary to their (also freely chosen) general commitment to act rightly. It is presumably that weak-willed individuals act against the background of having good wills that renders them less culpable than others who do wrong (127).

Hill describes one sort of weak-willed person as someone who has a "general intention always to do what is right and the capacity to act accordingly," but who "habitually lets himself be easily distracted and indulges a tendency to make self-serving excuses" (121). According to Hill's interpretation, Kant seems committed to the view that this person has better character and is less blameworthy for wrongdoing than any person who has an impure will. But this view is controversial. Consider two people, one of whom is a weak-willed person as just described, someone who, through his own choice (e.g., by indulging his tendency to make self-serving excuses) waivers and fails to act in accordance with a commitment he has made to do what is right. The second is someone who unfailingly abides by his commitment to the following principle: 'I will do what morality (as Kant construes it) demands, except when refraining from doing this would prevent a severe drop in the well-being of those I love, yet not result in a significant drop in anyone's welfare.' Is it plausible to maintain, as the view implies, that we are to judge the first person's actions contrary to duty as more culpable than the second person's or that we are to judge that the first person has something, namely a good will, which Kant characterizes as good without qualification, whereas the second lacks any such thing? (That the view in question has problematic implications is consistent with its being a viable interpretation of Kant, of course.)

A second particularly interesting project in the book is Hill's development of a Kantian framework for normative ethics. Inspired by Kant's discussion of the kingdom of ends, the basic idea is this. We need moral principles to guide our decisions, for example, ones that indicate whether or when breaking a promise is morally permissible. We are to arrive at, or, to echo language Hill sometimes employs (e.g., 218), "construct," these moral principles through reflection we carry out as "Kantian legislators." As such legislators, our deliberations are constrained and directed by the idea that persons have dignity. Hill says that this idea amounts to a "cluster of prescriptions about how to regard and treat human beings" (262-3). Indeed, a distinctive feature of his Kantian ethics is that we are to understand claims that something is valuable as claims regarding how we ought to see and treat that thing (e.g., 198, 218, 306).

At several points in the book (e.g., 217-19, 240-2), Hill describes the prescriptions that are to guide our work as Kantian legislators. It will be helpful to have an overview of his most complete list of them. First, he says, "we must treat persons only in ways that we could in principle justify to them as well as to all other rational persons who take an appropriately impartial perspective" (199). We can in principle justify to persons the particular treatment of someone, suggests Hill, if we conscientiously judge that all would endorse this treatment from the Kantian legislative perspective -- a perspective characterized by the prescriptions that follow. A second prescription holds that "because dignity is not a commensurable value, our deliberations about specific principles must not proceed as if the dignity of persons can be compared and weighed against the dignity of others" (199). Elsewhere, Hill says that Kantians "acknowledge no commensurable intrinsic values that can be aggregated across persons and maximized" (221).

According to a third prescription, "we must treat persons as beings with moral rights that restrict how we may treat them even to achieve good ends" (199). The content of these rights is to be specified against the background of the full set of prescriptions governing the Kantian legislative enterprise. Fourth, "the existence of each rational person is an objective end and so something to be valued by all rational persons" (200). This amounts to a strong, but not absolute, presumption against killing people and for helping them to have what they need to live as "rational autonomous" persons (200), says Hill. This prescription also implies that we should place a higher priority on "preserving human life than on goods and services whose value depends on nonrational inclinations" (200). Fifth, "dignity calls for expressions of respect and honor for persons, not for their social position, education, or achievements, but just as persons worthy of some deference and concern (200). Finally, we must "count the personal ends of others as worthy of our attention and aid" (200). As Kantian legislators, we are, in consultation with others, to deliberate with these prescriptions in mind in order to arrive at particular principles that "in our best judgment, are based on reasons adequate to justify the principles to others" (201).

Readers will recognize that these prescriptions are rooted in Kant's Categorical Imperative, especially in the formulas of humanity and of the kingdom of ends. In Kant's view the prescriptions are rather abstract expressions of basic commitments implicit in our own moral judgments (202, 273), Hill suggests.

Hill claims that his Kantian framework for normative ethics is superior to some rivals. Unlike some forms of Kantianism (e.g., some interpretations of the formula of humanity), his framework avoids absolutism of a sort that many find unacceptable, for example, an unconditional prohibition on lying, Hill implies. He also believes that his framework steers clear of an implausible feature of various forms of consequentialism, namely, the idea that the value of persons is "a determinable quantity, subject to permissible trade-offs" (331).

Hill's framework is an innovative development of Kantian ethics, but it prompts concerns. Consider a principle that would permit, but not require, a person to voluntarily kill himself (e.g., by jumping on a live grenade) when doing so is necessary to maximize the preservation of persons (e.g., in a case in which if the person does not jump on the grenade, five fellow soldiers will perish). It seems as if this principle would run afoul of the second prescription; for it appears to treat the value of persons as commensurable. Indeed, in light of the second prescription, Hill's Kantian legislative perspective may well generate a principle that forbids sacrificing oneself with the sole aim of preserving the (allegedly) greater value inherent in many others. But this sort of action (e.g., diving on a grenade so that one, not five, soldiers in one's platoon will die) is often considered not only morally permissible, but heroic.

In response, Hill might grant that a principle forbidding such self-sacrifice would indeed be implausible. But he might insist that his Kantian legislative perspective would not yield such a principle. Hill acknowledges that the precepts on his list invoke moral considerations that can conflict with one another. In light of this possibility, he holds that the second through the sixth prescriptions "provide strong presumptive considerations that may, in tragic cases, be overridden" (308). Perhaps in the self-sacrifice cases in question, which indeed seem tragic, the second prescription, regarding the non-commensurable worth of persons, would be overridden by the fourth, which invokes a strong presumption in favor of helping people to have what they need to live as rational autonomous persons.

Is this reply promising? Suppose that conscientious deliberators from the Kantian legislative perspective would weigh the fourth prescription more heavily than the third. What would then stop them from also weighing the fourth prescription so heavily that they would embrace a principle according to which it is permissible to kill one innocent person as a means to save five others? It won't do simply to appeal to the third prescription, which says that we must treat persons as beings with moral rights that restrict how we may treat them even to achieve good ends. For we are to determine the content of these rights from the Kantian legislative perspective, and there is no guarantee that we would settle on a right of one person not to be killed even if his death is necessary to save several others.

Further work might need to be done in order to demonstrate that Hill's Kantian constructivism provides a plausible alternative to excessively rigorist Kantianism and to consequentialist views that take an overly calculating approach to values. But neither this possibility, nor questions prompted by his Kantian interpretation of weakness of the will, should cast a shadow on the light Hill brings to the topics he discusses. Hill navigates their intricacies with a unique refinement and facility. Virtue, Rules, and Justice advances our understanding of core issues in moral philosophy.