Virtues and Their Vices

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Kevin Timpe and Craig A. Boyd (eds.), Virtues and Their Vices, Oxford University Press, 2014, 528pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199645541.

Reviewed by Bradford Cokelet, University of Miami


Kevin Timpe and Craig A. Boyd offer us twenty-two chapters that discuss a host of specific virtues and vices (sections 1-4) and reflect on the role of virtue in various disciplines (section 5). The papers on the specific virtues and vices are organized into four traditional categories -- cardinal virtues, capital vices and corrective virtues, intellectual virtues, and theological virtues -- and these seventeen articles make up the heart of the collection. As this categorical scheme might suggest, most of the authors discuss and defend Christian accounts of the virtues and vices, and the collection effectively draws one (theist or not) into thinking about how Aquinas-inspired virtue theory can speak to people today.

Before getting into the details, I should say that several articles could be fruitfully used in a contemporary moral problems or introduction to philosophy class, and that the articles in sections 1-3, perhaps coupled with some of the recent work on Kant's account of virtue, could deeply enrich discussion in an upper-level or graduate course on virtue theory or virtue ethics. These chapters allow non-theistic philosophers to glimpse the concrete ways in which theistically understood virtues promise to aptly structure and orient the psychologies, practices, and activities of people and communities who are oriented by a religious conception of the good. By extension, they provide a useful framework to ask questions about the specific virtues that those with very different conceptions of the good will need to embody or reflectively cultivate in order to embody their ideals or values.

I cannot discuss all twenty-two articles or even summarize critical reactions to the core group of seventeen. Instead, I am going to highlight some of the aspects of the collection as a whole that will make it especially valuable for teachers and scholars. I am going to leave aside the last five chapters, which explore interesting questions about virtue in different disciplines but which are not tightly integrated with the larger whole. These chapters are, however, well done. Philosophers interested in virtue in theology, civic virtue in political liberalism, virtue in positive psychology, neuroscience and virtue, and virtue and a feminist ethics of care are encouraged to take a look at them. Helpful overviews of these papers can be found in the editors' introduction (29-32).

Turning to what I think is the core of the collection, I want to begin by re-iterating that many of these papers will be of interest to philosophy teachers, theist and non-theist alike. Representative options here include the chapters "Lust and Chastity", "Gluttony and Abstinence" and "Sloth". They introduce various historical conceptions of the virtues, compare their relative strengths and weaknesses, and invite readers to either adopt a revised historical conception or think about what alternative virtue and vice concepts they can develop in their place. For example, Rebecca Konyndyk DeYoung's entry on sloth explains that on one traditional understanding of sloth, restless multi-taskers, and not just slackers, count as slothful. On this view, sloth involves a failure to mindfully and zealously embody devotion to the good in one's activities, and it therefore need not be associated with a lack of worldly ambition or be contrasted with the view that work is more important than leisure or family. This historical discussion helpfully reminds us that our ordinary assumptions about specific virtues and vices may be the result of historical contingencies, but it also pushes us to think about how our psychologies must be shaped if we are to be zealously and energetically oriented toward the good (however we conceive of it).

Colleen McCluskey's chapter on lust and chastity and Robert B. Kruschwitz's on gluttony and abstinence have arguments that get a bit more contentious, but this just adds to their appeal. McCluskey nicely discusses what Aquinas might say in response to Simon Blackburn's argument that lust can be a virtue and, while rejecting Blackburn's approach, she argues for an Aquinas-inspired position that is revised to fit contemporary thinking or common sense. Like DeYong's essay on sloth this one illustrates that the virtues enable us to embody love for (or appreciation of) the good in our activities and relationships and that they therefore enable us to live well. But McCluskey sounds another theme that runs through the collection: that to live intelligently or prudently we need to be oriented towards the right kinds of goods and be oriented towards them in a structured way that reflects their comparative value.

In the discussion of lust and charity, for example, we are invited to reflect on the goods of sexual pleasure in and out of various kinds of relationship, to reflect on our conceptions of better and worse relationships, and to then think about how we would need to be psychologically constituted in order to be aptly oriented towards the good of sexual pleasure and its relation to other goods. In Kruschwitz's discussion of gluttony and abstinence, we are invited to reflect on analogous questions regarding the pleasures of eating and drinking. In each case we are also asked to think about how the pleasures we take in one kind of thing (e.g., food) can give energy and enjoyment to activities that embody or nurture even greater goods (e.g., family meals that nurture good family relations). Taken together, these chapters encourage us to think about how we can best temper and cultivate our desires for various creature comforts, so that they will become integrated with our more distinctively human desires to embody our ideals or values and live a good life. These chapters invite us to develop, in other words, a concrete conception of temperance, as that virtue is insightfully discussed by Robert C. Roberts in section one.

Most of the essays in sections one and two have something instructive to say about how the virtues enable us to be energetically and aptly oriented by a hierarchically structured and integrated conception of the good, but they also discuss how vices or shortcomings in virtue can lead to disordered, or just plain bad, lives. This theme comes to the fore, but does not dominate, in the chapters that discuss the vices of avarice, anger, envy, and pride. Taken together, these chapters remind us that our characteristically human concerns for long term safety, control, power, social standing, and self-esteem can distort our thinking about and relationships with others, as well our ability to pursue our own good. Given the religious framework of many of the authors it is unsurprising that they get us to think about how these vices can distort one's proper relationship with God. But they also make many insightful points about how our disordered or inapt emotions, deliberations, and volitions can corrupt our relations to friends, family members, communities, etc. and inhibit our ability to successfully and prudently pursue worthwhile life-projects. Moreover, these reflections are coupled with ones about the virtuous (well-ordered and apt) emotions, deliberations, and volitions and the way they contribute to good relationships and successful, excellent projects. These chapters are all interesting in their own right, but also link to varying degrees with the insightful earlier chapters on prudence, fortitude, and justice, and the later ones on the theological virtues of faith, hope, and charity.

As a non-theist, I found the later set of overlaps particularly interesting because they allowed me to start to see what theists might have in mind when they claim that the theistic virtues in some way infuse and improve the shared "pagan" ones that non-theists recognize. For example, in "Charity: How Friendship with God Unfolds in Love for Others" Paul J. Wadell invites the reader to think about how friendship with God could not only justify and motivate love for enemies and strangers, or buttress our hope when we are in dire straights, but how it could also, "deepen and perfect," our more central attachments to family, friends, and community (384-85). More specifically, he says that the relation to God calls on us to be "more attentive, focused, and faithful in love" to our near and dear (384).

To a non-theist such claims can remain opaque and apparently ungrounded, and this collection provides some real help in this regard. When trying to make sense of the view that the theological virtues transform or infuse the moral ones, you can revisit the earlier chapters on the specific virtues and vices that enable or inhibit our abilities to be attentive, focused, and faithful in love and to be energetic and devoted in our pursuit of worthwhile projects. You can look in these chapters for clues about how a loving relationship with God could be thought to deepen and perfect the moral virtues that are recognizable as virtues in a non-theistic framework. At least in my case, this provoked an initially plausible, if somewhat obvious, suggestion: that various ordinary vices and short-comings in virtue are grounded in our inflated, unduly negative, or fragile sense of self-worth or self-esteem, and that by entering into a loving relationship with God you can at least in principle (and perhaps with graceful intervention or co-operation) adopt a warranted and resilient sense of your worth. Now this is only one possibility. Non-theists might accept the claim about the common cause of vice and then offer an alternative story about how agents can develop a warranted and resilient sense of self worth -- drawing on the responses to this problem that we find in Kant, Aristotle, or the Buddhists, for example. But I hope this example illustrates the way that this collection allows one to think critically both about how to develop a theistic account of the virtues and their role in the good life, and the way that the account helps non-theists see how they can benefit by engaging with more traditional theistic conceptions.

My comments up to now have focused on the sections that discuss the moral and theological virtues, and I want to end with some brief comments about the section on the epistemic virtues. This section has three excellent essays by philosophers working in the virtue epistemology tradition -- Linda Zagzebski on trust, John Greco on knowledge and understanding, and Jason Baehr on theoretical wisdom/sophia. Taken together these essays provide a lucid and inviting overview of the epistemic virtues and the ways that virtue epistemology enriches our thinking about epistemic assessments, strategies, and goals. Given the larger theme of the collection (virtues and their vices), however, I was left wanting a substantive discussion of various epistemic vices. For example, it would have been very nice to see what virtue epistemologists, especially theologically informed ones, can add to our thinking about epistemic injustice of the sort discussed by Miranda Fricker or to hear more about the epistemic issues that come up in thinking about moral education. More generally, the collection naturally provokes questions about how epistemic, moral, and theological virtues and vices might be inter-twined, and it would have been nice to have some essays on this topic -- for example one discussing the ethics of belief, Kant's worries about religious enthusiasm, or epistemic issues that crop up when we think about moral education and autonomy.

Finally, I found it a bit odd that a book so resolutely focused on showing that history can help us think more deeply and creatively about the virtues has little to no discussion of Kant's conception of virtue and all of the good work that has recently been done on that topic. Of course no collection can do it all, and I suppose these desires for more entries in a book that already runs 528 pages just reflect the value that the volume has. This is a large collection, and it could be better unified around a guiding purpose, but I nonetheless think it is surprisingly successful as a whole and that the individual essays should prove useful for both scholars and teachers.