Virtues and Vices in Positive Psychology: A Philosophical Critique

Placeholder book cover

Kristján Kristjánsson, Virtues and Vices in Positive Psychology: A Philosophical Critique, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 254pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107025202.

Reviewed by Christian B. Miller, Wake Forest University


According to one version of events, the main idea behind the positive psychology movement was born during a holiday discussion between Mihaly Csikszentmihalyi and Martin Seligman in 1997 (Csikszentmihalyi 2003). But what may have started as a conversation during the holidays has now exploded into one of the most active areas of research in psychology. Hundreds of millions of grant dollars have been spent, dozens of conferences have been organized, and several new journals have been publishing at a rapid pace, most notably The Journal of Positive Psychology, which launched in 2006.

Philosophers, meanwhile, have said almost nothing about this movement. Perhaps this would not have been surprising 30 or 40 years ago. But in the past 15 years, empirically informed philosophy has become all the rage, especially in ethics and moral psychology. Much attention has been paid, for instance, to studies in the situationist tradition of social psychology.

Kristján Kristjánsson's new book is the first detailed treatment of positive psychology from a philosophical perspective (at least as far as I am aware). Kristjánsson has been an active contributor to a number of debates in recent years at the intersection of moral philosophy, psychology, and education, and brings his vast familiarity with the relevant literature to bear in engaging with this movement. The result is a book that raises a number of good questions and concerns about positive psychology, but in a way that is sympathetic to the movement and aimed at ultimately supporting and refining the work that these psychologists are doing.

I will brief summarize the chapters of Kristjánsson's book before taking up two topics -- motivational internalism and situationism about character -- in more detail.

Kristjánsson begins by offering a quick overview of the historical development of positive psychology, as well as some relevant psychological, philosophical, and educational context for appreciating the movement. He also states right at the beginning that his "explicit aim [in this book] is to tease out and critique the conceptual/philosophical foundations of positive psychology and its educational implications" (4, emphasis removed).

Broadly speaking, the positive psychology movement can be framed in terms of three central pillars (11): positive experiences, positive traits, and positive institutions. And uniting all three of these pillars is the concept of happiness, which is arguably the central concept for positive psychologists. Hence it is appropriate that Kristjánsson begins his first substantive chapter with that concept. He reviews hedonic, life-satisfaction, and eudaimonic accounts, and spends some time on Dan Haybron's recent view. He then turns to positive psychology and helpfully documents how Seligman's view of happiness in particular has evolved over time.

Central to happiness or flourishing for positive psychologists are the moral virtues. So chapter three turns to some features of their work on the virtues, in particular the 6 moral virtues and 24 character strengths, as outlined in the leading positive psychology handbook authored by Peterson and Seligman (2004). Kristjánsson's main focus is to compare this trait framework with the Big Five trait approach that currently dominates personality psychology. On this approach, very roughly, individual differences in personalities can be understood using 5 broad trait labels (extraversion, openness to experience, agreeableness, consciousness, and neuroticism), along with 6 facets for each label (for a detailed review, see Miller 2014). Kristjánsson sides with positive psychologists in thinking that this taxonomy leaves out important information about moral character, and he advances a number of additional criticisms of the Big Five approach.

Chapter four turns to questions about moral metaphysics, in the service of addressing what Kristjánsson sees as a fundamental dilemma for positive psychologists. On the one hand, if they refrain from making any moral claims at all, then they will not be able to maintain that certain means to finding happiness are better than others, or that certain character traits are more virtuous than others. On the other hand, if they start making moral claims, then the worry is that they will violate Hume's law and no longer be speaking as psychologists but rather as moralists. Kristjánsson's response in this chapter, briefly, is to distinguish between evaluations (which employ axiological moral language) and prescriptions (which employ deontological moral language). He then seeks to show that there is a version of Hume's law for each, and that Hume's law is plausible only in the case of deriving deontological moral statements from factual statements.

Chapter five is an extended discussion of motivational internalism, and chapter six is an extended discussion of situationism in psychology and philosophy. I take up each of these topics in more detail later in the review.

Chapter seven takes a more critical stance towards positive psychology by focusing on what, in Kristjánsson's view, is a major omission from the framework, namely the Aristotelian notion of practical wisdom. In particular, he thinks there needs to be a master virtue that can step in when there are conflicts between particular virtues. Chapter eight then turns to positive psychology and positive experiences, with a focus on flow experiences and on positive emotions. Kristjánsson helpfully calls attention to the ways in which unpleasant emotions can also be important to character building and moral action, and so deserve more attention in this literature. Chapter nine, the last substantive chapter before some brief concluding remarks, looks at education from the perspective of positive psychology and considers whether the movement has anything new and/or valuable to offer to teachers, parents, and school administrators. Kristjánsson considers a range of topics, including specific interventions informed by positive psychology, the paradoxes of virtue education, the role of resiliency and mindfulness, and the leading criticisms leveled against so-called 'positive education.'

Before returning to chapters five and six in more detail, a quick word about style. For philosophers in the analytic tradition, I suspect there will be a couple of different reactions to this book. Kristjánsson employs an unusual style of having an imaginary conversation partner interject at various points in each chapter, mainly to ask for clarification when the discussion has become more complicated. For instance, the interlocutor says at one point: "You're using a plethora of exotic terms here. What do 'naturalism' and 'non-naturalism' really mean in ordinary language?" (17, emphasis removed). While unconventional, I found this device helpful. Kristjánsson is trying to write in a way that is accessible to psychologists without a lot of philosophical training, as well as to the usual philosophical crowd in ethics. This technique provides him with a nice means to slow down and more patiently explain relevant background material.

On the other hand, I suspect many philosophers will not react as well to another stylistic feature, which is a tendency to go over the top with some rhetorical flourishes. Here is an example: "the moral situationists set out to assassinate not only character, but also personality" (140). Similarly, concerning the Big Five approach in personality psychology, Kristjánsson writes that,

a mere statistical procedure, pulled out by sleight of hand from some black box during the process of data distillation, can hardly [be] treated as an automatic truth generator. . . . No scientific approach or method -- of whatever level of catchpenny tricks and justificatory acrobatics -- absolves us of the responsibility to get that philosophy right. (78-79)

This, to my ear, is distracting. I would rather that the arguments speak for themselves, rather than using language like this, which is sure to offend advocates of these views.

But enough about style. One place where I had a concern with the substance of Kristjánsson's discussion had to do with his extensive treatment of motivational internalism in chapter five. Kristjánsson's motivation for going down this path is that he believes the internalism/externalism debate has direct relevance to "whether positive psychology can remain a science while advancing truths about the good, virtuous life" (111). Recall that in chapter four, Kristjánsson has already argued that the positive psychologist, qua psychologist, is perfectly entitled to make axiological claims (or evaluative claims, as he calls them) about the goodness of outcomes or the virtue of people. But at the same time, Kristjánsson claims that, qua psychologist, she is not entitled to make deontological claims (or "prescriptive claims," as he calls them) about the rightness or wrongness of actions.

The worry that Kristjánsson seeks to address in chapter five is that motivational internalism, as he understands it, would make it conceptually impossible to pull off this move. For according to motivational internalism, axiological judgments as a matter of conceptual necessity are going to entail deontological judgments. In more detail, motivational internalism is formulated as the claim that:

(1)  If agents sincerely pass moral judgments about the goodness or rightness of act x, they will be at least weakly intrinsically motivated to do x -- unless they are practically irrational on grounds of a general motivational disorder. This is a conceptual truth (112).

And from this Kristjánsson claims the following "corollary" follows:

(1a)   A sincerely advanced theory about the moral goodness or rightness of act x necessarily contains at least a prima facie prescription to do x. (113)

While positive psychologists would not put things explicitly in these terms, according to Kristjánsson it is precisely these claims that "worr[y] positive psychologists, who implicitly accept motivational internalism but simultaneously remain adamant that psychological science cannot (qua science) prescribe, not even prima facie" (113).

Now I agree that (1) is one reasonable way of formulating motivational internalism, out of the numerous versions that exist in the literature (see Miller 2008 for many of the leading formulations). And like Kristjánsson, I, too, agree that (1) is false (Miller 2008). But I have two concerns about the way that Kristjánsson has framed this discussion.

First, note that (1) contains "rightness of act x" in the antecedent. And recall that moral "prescriptions" are just deontological moral statements -- "to prescribe x as the right thing to do" (110). So suppose I sincerely morally judge that famine relief is right. Then what (1) and (1a) amount to is:

(1*) If I sincerely morally judge that famine relief is right, then I will be either intrinsically motivated or practically irrational, and I will be prescribing that famine relief is right.

But consider that last part -- of course, if I sincerely morally judge that P is right, then I am prescribing that P is right. It will be difficult for Kristjánsson to reject that claim.

It seems clear that Kristjánsson should have left the "or rightness of act x" clause out of (1). Suppose he does. Then I can't see any reason to accept (1a), nor do I know of any philosopher writing about motivational internalism who has ever advanced it. For this would be saying, in effect, that:

(1~)  If I sincerely morally judge that famine relief is good, then I will be either intrinsically motivated or practically irrational, and I will be prescribing that famine relief is right.

But I take it to be apparent that morally judging that famine relief is good does not, as a matter of conceptual necessity, entail prescribing that famine relief is right (in the sense of obligatory). Plenty of actions are good and still morally optional. Indeed, it is not even clear that judging an act to be morally good must entail prescribing it as right in the sense of being not-wrong. According to simple act utilitarianism, for instance, all actions that are good but not as good as the best action that could be performed by a person in the circumstances, are morally wrong for that person to do. An act utilitarian can make the goodness judgment but at the same time prescribe that the action not be performed.

The upshot, then, is that, like Kristjánsson, I agree that (1a) is false, but we did not need a chapter to show this. It was a non-starter. But to be fair, Kristjánsson is not intending this chapter to be a contribution to the latest philosophical debates on motivational internalism, which is something he has already done elsewhere. Rather he claims that something like (1a) is (implicitly, to be sure) behind the worries that positive psychologists have about not becoming moralists. He knows this literature in psychology far better than I do, and if his diagnosis of positive psychologists is correct, then at least as far as (1a) is concerned, there is nothing to worry about here.

As Kristjánsson notes, "There is a strange lacuna in the extensive positive psychology literature on character strengths and virtues" (131), namely that there has been very little said about the situationist movement in social psychology, which primarily dates back to the 1960s. Kristjánsson addresses this lacuna in chapter six, and has some things to say that have not yet been covered, at least in the now extensive literature in philosophy on situationism (for a review of the situationist literatures in both fields, see Miller 2014).

Positive psychologists need to say something about situationism, it would seem. For they are committed on empirical grounds to understanding people in terms of the six virtues and twenty-four character strengths, traits that are supposed to be stable over time and consistent across situations. But a common theme in situationist writings in both psychology and philosophy is that cross-situationally consistent, so-called 'broad' character traits do not exist, or if they do, they are rarely instantiated and so rarely play any explanatory or predictive role in understanding human behavior. Instead moral behavior is said to be highly dependent on the features of particular situations, features that are often either not morally relevant or even morally problematic.

One would expect, then, that as someone who is sympathetic to positive psychology, Kristjánsson would dive right into the situationist literatures in the two fields and outline what he takes to be the best strategies for criticizing their evidence and reasoning. Kristjánsson does spend a few pages rehearsing some of the standard moves in the debates about situationism, but that is not his main focus. He has engaged with these debates thoroughly in previous work, and believes that at this point, much of the literature on situationism is at a stalemate or has simply grown stale. Instead, he writes that "my real aim is to secure a deeper understanding of the concept of a moral situation underlying this debate" (134). Kristjánsson is quite right to call our attention to a sadly neglected feature of this literature, which is that no one seems to have a good account of what situations are in the first place. So if Kristjánsson could provide such an account, then that would be a major step forward.

What we end up getting is not quite an account or a detailed proposal, but we do get a number of interesting distinctions. Start with an Aristotelian approach to individuating situations "in terms of the virtue it naturally elicits or fails to elicit" (146). These are what Kristjánsson calls "virtue-calibrated situations" (146), such as experiencing pain at another's unjust misfortune, which would be a situation relevant to the virtue of compassion. And now consider the following four distinctions (147-148):

Broad versus narrow situations: Kristjánsson's examples are 'the situation of women' versus a 'dime-finding, dropped paper situation.'

Passive versus active situations: Kristjánsson's example are a customer during a bank robbery versus the bank robber carrying out the robbery.

Extreme versus mundane situations: Kristjánsson example of an extreme situation is the standard trolley case. He does not give an example of a mundane situation.

Strong versus weak situations: Kristjánsson's examples are funerals and drama improvisations, respectively.

Using these distinctions, Kristjánsson's main conclusion is that situationism is more plausible for "broad, passive, extreme, and strong situations," whereas traditional trait accounts are more plausible for "narrow, active, mundane and weak situations" (148).

To be sure, there are some classic situationist studies that come close to fitting these labels. Stanley Milgram's famous experiment #5, for instance, involved a situation that was extreme and strong (but was it broad and passive?). Yet consider Alice Isen's phone booth experiment, one of the studies commonly cited by situationists like Gilbert Harman and John Doris. Participants finding a dime in the coin return slot of a payphone were much more likely to pick up dropped papers (Isen and Levin 1972). Using Kristjánsson's distinctions, wouldn't this count as narrow, mundane, and weak (indeed, he even used it as an example of a narrow situation (147))? Or consider these two studies, which have been linked to situationist explanations of behavior:

Bathroom. 45% of participants agreed to deliver some documents 40 meters away in the control condition of a study by Arnie Cann and Jill Goodman Blackwelder, but 80% of people did so in the experimental condition. The only difference was that these participants had just exited a public bathroom (Cann and Blackwelder 1984: 224).

Smells. 60% of women who walked past stores with pleasant fragrances, like Cinnabon and Mrs. Field's Cookies, subsequently performed a small helping task, whereas roughly 15% of women who passed clothing stores helped with the same task (Baron 1997).

The key situationist point is that minor changes in the environment, changes that have no apparent moral relevance in themselves, led to very significant changes in morally relevant behavior. And yet, using Kristjánsson's distinctions, these are situations which are, at the very least, narrow and mundane.

So while Kristjánsson has helpfully introduced some interesting distinctions into the situationism literature, I am not sure that they end up sorting out the experimental literature in the right way. But they can, I suspect, be put to good use by positive psychologists and others in thinking about situations more generally.

As is typical in reviews, I have focused on places of disagreement. But there is much in Kristjánsson's book with which I strongly agree. I share his sympathies with the work that positive psychologists are doing -- it is typically valuable and important research, and I look forward to what they will discover in the future. I also second many of Kristjánsson's recommendations for how to do that work better. For instance, the omission of practical wisdom from their framework is an important one that should be rectified, and for precisely the reasons that Kristjánsson outlines. Overall, then, this is clearly required reading for philosophers and (perhaps even more so) psychologists who are interested in positive psychology or who count themselves as participants in this thriving movement.


Support for this work was funded in part by a grant from the Templeton World Charity Foundation. The opinions expressed in this paper are my own and do not necessarily reflect the views of the foundation.


Baron, R. (1997). "The Sweet Smell of . . . Helping: Effects of Pleasant Ambient Fragrance on Prosocial Behavior in Shopping Malls." Personality and Social Psychology Bulletin 23: 498-503.

Cann, A. and J. Blackwelder. (1984). "Compliance and Mood: A Field Investigation of the Impact of Embarrassment." The Journal of Psychology 117: 221-226.

Csikszentmihalyi, M. (2003). "Legs or Wings? A Reply to R. S. Lazarus." Psychological Inquiry 14: 113-115.

Isen, A. and P. Levin. (1972). "Effect of Feeling Good on Helping: Cookies and Kindness." Journal of Personality and Social Psychology 21: 384-388.

Miller, Christian. (2008). "Motivational Internalism." Philosophical Studies 139: 233-255.

---. (2014). Character and Moral Psychology. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Peterson, C. and M. Seligman. (2004). Character Strengths and Virtues: A Handbook and Classification. Oxford: Oxford University Press.