Virtue's Reasons: New Essays on Virtue, Character, and Reasons

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Noell Birondo and S. Stewart Braun (eds.), Virtue's Reasons: New Essays on Virtue, Character, and Reasons, Routledge, 2017, 210pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138231733.

Reviewed by Jason Kawall, Colgate University


According to the editors, Noell Birondo and S. Stewart Braun,

The main aims of this book are . . . to foster a greater appreciation for the multiplicity of reasons surrounding the concept of the virtues and to shed light on what is presumably the paradigm case, of an individual agent responding to an array of potential reasons, often in diverse circumstances and contexts. (2-3)

While the virtues are often treated as allowing agents to recognize and respond appropriately to reasons, Birondo and Braun note that there are broader connections and questions concerning the relationship between reasons and the virtues that warrant examination: for example, are there distinctive kinds of reasons to become a certain kind of person, rather than simply reasons to act or respond in certain ways? Upon what reasons can agents act appropriately while developing the virtues, and can we simply will to act upon some reasons and not others?

The current volume consists of ten chapters intended to explore the relationship(s) between virtues and reasons, divided into three parts, with a short introductory essay by Birondo and Braun. As they note in their introduction, the volume is very wide-ranging, and

By addressing a diverse set of questions on the connections between virtues and reasons, the papers here do not offer a sustained treatment of one or two core issues; instead, the papers that we have collected here form, together, a kind of kaleidoscope of issues surrounding the notion of virtue's reasons. (2)

While each of the chapters mentions reasons, and some include extended discussion of such (in varying contexts), it is virtue theory and character that truly serve to unify the volume. With respect to reasons, there is significant discussion of work by John McDowell and Robert Audi, but little overall engagement with the broader, extensive recent literature on the topic. That said, however, the chapters in this volume tend to be of a very high quality -- and some are truly excellent, with the potential to shape future discussion in the area. Given that the chapters in this volume are so diverse, with widely varying topics and approaches, I will focus on providing overviews of each, rather than attempting to provide a unified, thematic discussion.

Part I, "Reasons, Character, and Agency", consists of four papers. While there are few connections linking them, each chapter is strong and raises interesting issues in its own right. Garrett Cullity's "Moral Virtues and Responsiveness for Reasons" is extremely dense and detailed; to be honest, I've read this chapter several times and remain uncertain whether I entirely grasp all of it. In the first part of the chapter Cullity provides criteria for the application of various aretaic terms to traits and dispositions, but also to actions and other entities. These criteria vary quite significantly -- for example, whether an action is honest depends solely on the aim of the action, whereas whether an action is kind depends on its aim, but also its motive, and the manner in which it is performed. In the later parts of his paper Cullity develops a unique taxonomy of the virtues. Moral virtues are characterized by responding appropriately to morally relevant reasons, and for each response there is the reason for the response, the object of the response, and the response itself. Cullity proposes a corresponding threefold set of categories of virtue: those characterized by good responsiveness to particular reasons, those involving responding well to particular objects, and those that involve responding well to a variety of different objects or reasons; Cullity distinguishes further subcategories of each. This is the barest sketch of Cullity's chapter, and omits a great deal -- the chapter rewards multiple readings. Still, I worry that the tremendous detail, including many qualifications and exceptions to his various proposals might limit the use of Cullity's taxonomy by others.

Justin Oakley's "Remote Scenarios and Warranted Virtue Attributions" is a thoughtful, lucid paper addressing the following issue: how does the behaviour (actual or counterfactual) of agents in unlikely or remote scenarios affect our epistemic justification for attributing virtues or vices to them? For example, how would an agent's counterfactual behaviour when caught on-board a ship during a severe storm affect our justification in attributing courage to her? A highly demanding answer would hold that all such remote circumstances are relevant -- if a person would act poorly under extreme conditions, then we should not attribute courage (or other relevant virtues) to her. Robert Adams defends what Oakley refers to as a 'probabilistic' approach, where the relevance of behaviour in remote situations is a function of how likely an agent is to find herself in such circumstances. Similarly, in a given remote situation, the more likely an agent is to act well compared to a second agent, the more justified we are in attributing the relevant virtue to her. Oakley argues, plausibly, that we need to further qualify the probabilistic approach in at least two ways. First, the reason(s) why an agent is likely to act in a certain way (in a given scenario) are relevant -- is it the result of training and reflection, or mere luck? Second, we need to consider whether the agent (in actual circumstances) would approve of her actions and the reasons for them in remote scenarios. A committed utilitarian might, under extreme circumstances, leave his spouse to assist an aid group instead. While such circumstances might be unlikely, if the utilitarian would now approve of his reasons and actions under the extreme conditions, this would be relevant to our attributions of such virtues as loyalty.

In "Vice, Reasons, and Wrongdoing", Damian Cox defends a form of 'vice ethics'. Where virtue ethics defines right action in terms of virtues, vice ethics defines wrongness -- and rightness -- in terms of vices. Cox argues that reasons to avoid vicious action are typically pro tanto while reasons to perform virtuous actions are typically only prima facie. He further suggests that we can treat actions as supererogatory (most virtuous actions), merely permissible (actions that are neither virtuous nor vicious), or wrong (most vicious actions). And more precisely, with respect to right action, Cox suggests

(R) An action is right iff it is the least vicious of available actions.

(W) An action is wrong iff it is not the least vicious of available actions. (55)

Often there will be multiple actions available to an agent that are equally free of vice; all would be right. Cox develops the proposal effectively, and it certainly warrants discussion in the literature. Still, some questions arise. Consider two agents in similar circumstances making charitable donations. One merely gives five dollars without any vicious motives, while the other gives several thousand dollars, almost entirely out of generosity, but also with the hint of a vain desire to impress some friends; the generosity would have been sufficient to motivate the action. On Cox's proposal, the agent merely giving five dollars acts rightly, while the far more generous donation is wrong because of the incidental vicious motive; it would not be among the least vicious actions available. As such, trace amounts of vice could implausibly render otherwise excellent actions wrong.

"Can Virtue Be Codified? An Inquiry on the Basis of Four Conceptions of Virtue" by Peter Shiu-Hwa Tsu is the final paper of part I. Tsu argues against McDowell's well-known "uncodifiability thesis", according to which the requirements and reasons of the virtues cannot be codified into rules. After drawing attention to the complexity and ambiguity of the uncodifiability thesis (e.g. what counts as a rule?), Tsu presents four conceptions of the relationship between virtues and rules. On the particularist conception, there are not even broad generalizations that hold between virtues and rules; on the prima facie conception, any rules would only roughly capture the basic content of virtues, and would have many exceptions. According to the pro tanto conception, pro tanto rules determine what a virtuous agent should do, while "in cases of moral conflicts . . . it takes practical wisdom or judgment to determine which rule 'outweighs' which" (80). Finally, according to the absolute conception, virtuous agents act in accordance with a (or a set of) absolute, exceptionless moral principle(s); this need not involve mechanical rule-following -- we can demonstrate judgment in applying the principle(s). Tsu argues that McDowell focuses on the first two conceptions, but that the absolute and pro tanto conceptions would allow for the codifiability of the reasons of virtue, and are in fact more attractive than the rival conceptions. This is another strong chapter -- though many of the objections raised by Tsu to particularist and prima facia conceptions rely on particular features of McDowell's view that need not be embraced by all those endorsing the uncodifiability thesis.

Part II, "Reasons and Virtues in Development", is the most unified section of the volume, consisting of three chapters addressing how non-virtuous agents can develop the virtues. Ramon Das considers how such agents can act rightly despite lacking the virtues. Emer O'Hagan addresses how agents might effectively and appropriately aim at developing their own virtues. And Audi addresses the nature and place of role-modeling in the development of the virtues.

In "Virtue, Reason, and Will" Das argues that two tempting positions for virtue ethicists -- holding that right action either requires acting from good motives or reasons, or (more strongly) requires acting from firm, stable virtues -- are implausibly demanding. After all, both would seem beyond the ability of anyone who is not already virtuous -- we can't simply will ourselves to have good motives. Das suggests that we need to more carefully distinguish good motives and good reasons. Broadly, Das sees motives as (paradigmatically) desires that are involuntary, while normative reasons are cognitive and capable of producing motives. Das argues that an agent might recognize a normative reason to help a person and as a result choose to help her (voluntarily) despite the lack of an antecedent desire or motive to do so. Das provides some admittedly brief remarks in defence of this view, and in turn argues that we would be best to move away from distinctively virtue-ethical approaches to right action requiring good motives or virtues. Das concludes by arguing against Dan Russell's proposal that we sharply distinguish between right action (a form of action evaluation) and what an agent ought to do (a matter of action guidance); this proposal would undermine concerns that ordinary people cannot act rightly given standard virtue ethics. Das's critique of Russell's proposal is compelling -- particularly in arguing that if we sharply distinguish between right action and what an agent ought to do, the normative significance of rightness becomes highly unclear. This is a strong chapter, developing Das's previous, influential critiques of virtue ethics in new ways.

In her "Self-Knowledge and the Development of Virtue" O'Hagan carefully explores how agents might intentionally develop the virtues, focusing on the ways in which a morally refined self-knowledge could shape their sensitivity to virtuous reasons. O'Hagan begins by noting constraints upon the reasons for which agents might act while developing the virtues. For example, they cannot (typically) perform an action because it would be the kind thing to do and would improve their character. Rather, they would need to perform the action out of a concern for the well-being of the person they would help. The latter reflects a nascent kindness; the former a potentially problematic concern with their own virtue. O'Hagan then considers how we might shape the reasons upon which we act. She agrees with Audi that we cannot directly will ourselves to act (or not) on a given reason or set of reasons. But O'Hagan argues that our ability to direct our attention through self-knowledge and self-awareness provides us with rich indirect control over the reasons for which we act; there is no need to see ourselves as limited in this regard. For example, we might learn that people tend to overlook morally salient reasons when they are in a great hurry. This knowledge could ground a concern to reflect and pay greater attention when feeling time-pressured, allowing us to recognize reasons we might otherwise miss, and providing an important form of control over the reasons for which we act.

The final paper of Part II is Audi's insightful and wide-ranging "Aretaic Role Modeling, Justificatory Reasons, and the Diversity of the Virtues". Audi first explores the nature of role-modeling of both moral and intellectual virtues, drawing attention to often-overlooked issues (e.g. distinguishing between role-modeling as such and providing commentary upon what one is doing to a learner). He then turns to arguing that reasons are explanatorily prior to virtues -- actions from virtue must be performed for an appropriate reason (132), and role-modeling virtues requires an appreciation or responsiveness to reasons on the part of both the agent and a learner (133). If there were not prior reasons to which virtuous agents were responsive, what would explain and justify their actions? In the second half of his paper, Audi explores a wide range of virtues, with an eye towards shedding light on both intellectual and moral virtues, as well as 'cross-over' virtues that are both (such as sensitivity and consistency). Audi draws attention to the rich breadth and variety of virtues, which in turn impacts how these virtues can be successfully role-modeled. I cannot do justice here to the full range of issues addressed by Audi in this paper; there is a tremendous amount of substance and insightful reflection concerning the virtues and their development.

The final section, Part III, "Specific Virtues for Finite Rational Agents", consists of three chapters. Here again, the individual chapters are rich and rewarding, even while there are not strong thematic connections between them.

Reasons pluralists argue that there are rationally incomparable, and thereby incommensurable, kinds of reasons. A familiar worry for such views is that we would too frequently lack practical rational guidance because we so often face incomparable sets of reasons. In his "Practical Wisdom: A Virtue for Resolving Conflicts among Practical Reasons", Andrés Luco defends reasons pluralism by proposing an "Override Principle" that can apply in (many) such cases of conflict. Luco's override principle states that when we face sets of incomparable reasons, then set A overrides set B if (i) a certain action is necessary for promoting some good associated with set A, and (ii) not acting on set B would not result in the loss of any goods associated with set B (153). We would thus have a principle of practical reason that could allow us, in a wide range of cases, to rationally endorse an action, even when faced with incomparable kinds of reasons. The majority of the chapter involves Luco considering how the override principle might be applied to such decisions as whether to pursue a career in philosophy (largely grounded in self-regarding reasons) or instead to pursue a career that would help others as much as possible, as recommended by effective altruists (grounded in impartial reasons). Luco's discussion is compelling as he notes the complexities of applying the override principle. Still, while Luco arrives at plausible answers for various test scenarios, it is perhaps unclear to what extent the override principle is in fact driving these answers, and to what extent Luco is instead appealing to other factors and intuitions and then "applying" the override principle in an ad hoc fashion to capture the desired results.

The final two chapters are by the volume's editors. Braun's chapter on "The Virtue of Modesty and the Egalitarian Ethos" provides an attractive, irenic account of modesty. He first distinguishes three broad approaches to modesty in the literature: Julia Driver's influential 'ignorance' view (that requires an underestimate of the agent's own talents and achievements), perspectival views (that require seeing one's accomplishments from some particular perspective -- perhaps recognizing the roles of luck or opportunity), and de-emphasis views (that require downplaying or directing attention away from one's accomplishments). Braun's engagement with these approaches leads to his own "Egalitarian" account: "A modest agent is an agent that is disposed to act in a manner consistent with attempts to avoid establishing or endorsing distinctions in social or civic standing, ranking, or respect, which are applicable to herself, both at an institutional level and at a local community level" (176-7). As Braun notes, modesty seems to involve an unwillingness to treat oneself as more worthy than others; the egalitarian account captures this unwillingness, and the embrace of social equality could explain why modesty is a moral virtue. Certain questions do arise -- for example, if a rejection of distinctions in social ranking underlies modesty, wouldn't activism and social protest against hierarchies count as paradigmatic instances of modesty? If not, why not? Still Braun's approach seems very promising and worthy of further development.

The volume closes with Birondo's "Virtue and Prejudice: Giving and Taking Reasons". Birondo addresses a familiar worry for eudaimonistic virtue ethics: that their foundational appeal to human nature (in determining what constitutes flourishing) is bound to be problematic. Birondo focuses his attention on a recent version of the worry presented by Jesse Prinz. Broadly, Prinz argues that if eudaimonists hold that a proper understanding of eudaimonia can only be achieved by those who are themselves virtuous, problematic circularities will arise. On the other hand, if eudaimonists embrace an external standard of eudaimonia that can be identified without possession of the virtues, this standard cannot be justified -- there is too much cultural variation in conceptions of flourishing and there is no non-question-begging way of determining which of these conceptions are superior to others; we cannot justify any antecedent, universal human nature that could ground eudaimonia and the virtues. In replying to Prinz, Birondo draws stark attention to the ways in which critics of virtue ethics often ignore relevant literature and responses by virtue ethicists. According to Birondo's own response to Prinz, we must recognize that our understandings of human nature and eudaimonia are works in progress across different cultures. Birondo argues for an internalist account of eudaimonia, where the nature of eudaimonia is determined by the virtuous, but where ordinary folk can still understand this conception. He further stresses that we need to be open to both taking and giving reasons across cultures to improve and refine our conceptions of virtue and eudaimonia over time; there is no foundational appeal to an antecedently identified human nature. This is a sharp paper that effectively defends a plausible, pluralist form of eudaimonism.

Overall, this is a strong collection of insightful and often thought-provoking papers. There are, of course, some limitations; most prominently, while there are suggestive and interesting contributions to understanding the connections between reasons and virtues, the chapters vary significantly in the depth of their engagement with such issues. But understood as a wide-ranging contribution to the leading-edge literature on virtue theory and character, the volume stands up very well.