Virtuous Emotions

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Kristján Kristjánsson, Virtuous Emotions, Oxford University Press, 2018, 225pp., $61.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198809678.

Reviewed by Sara Protasi, University of Puget Sound


Where do we draw the line between moral and moralistic, righteous and self-righteous, saintly and sanctimonious? This is what I kept wondering while reading Kristján Kristjánsson's book.

Stimulating and ambitious, it is a must-read for anyone interested in one of the many areas it addresses: moral philosophers are its primary audience, in particular those of Aristotelian and virtue ethics leaning; ancient specialists will find that Kristjánsson, while not pursuing a historically accurate interpretation of Aristotle, is attentive and knowledgeable with regard to the texts, and will appreciate the insights he brings into Aristotelian ethics; emotion theorists, especially those interested in the role of emotions in moral education, will appreciate his "unapologetically interdisciplinary" (3) approach, and how the desire for conceptual rigor is balanced by empirical awareness; education scholars will find it invaluable in providing conceptual clarification and connections between philosophical and pedagogical approaches; finally, readers interested specifically in gratitude, pity, shame, jealousy, grief, or awe will enjoy the self-contained chapters on these emotions.

Kristjánsson's general Aristotle-inspired is that emotions are elicited by appearances (phantasia), which are then elaborated upon and interpreted through evaluative thought and always accompanied by affect. His perspective on moral education is similarly Aristotle-inspired: ethics is studied with the practical aim of becoming good. This practical aim does not make the discussion any less rigorous, however. The initial two chapters set out the book's theoretical framework. Even though they are replete with definitions and distinctions, the writing is never arid or obscure, thanks to Kristjánsson's clear, exact, and vivid prose.

Chapter 1 provides an explanation of why and how Kristjánsson uses the Aristotelian framework to think about emotions that Aristotle himself either ignored, neglected, or rejected altogether. These emotions are argued to be either fully virtuous, or conducive to virtue and thus appropriate to earlier developmental stages, that is, those prior to the attainment of phronesis (practical wisdom) or megalopsuchia (lit. "greatness of the soul"). The project is thus not Aristotelian in the letter, but in spirit: like Aristotle, Kristjánsson takes an empirically-informed approach to considering emotions as a crucial component of a flourishing life.

Chapter 2 focuses on the relation between emotions and moral value. It nicely distinguishes between competing moral epistemologies and theories of human motivation, emphasizing their advantages and disadvantages. This chapter in particular exemplifies Kristjánsson's care for conceptual clarity and his love for tidying up the logical space in a way that is never fetishistic or speculative: he always refers extensively to positions present in the literature.

The following six chapters are each devoted to a specific emotion -- gratitude, pity, shame, jealousy, grief, and awe -- and share a similar structure. In each, Kristjánsson starts with an interdisciplinary literature review, which includes what Aristotle said, or didn't say, of the emotion; he then considers explicit or implicit tensions with other Aristotelian commitments; and, finally, he solves those tensions and argues that each emotion is either intrinsically valuable, that is, an indispensable component of eudaimonia (human flourishing), or at least instrumentally good in the path to it. For each emotion, Kristjánsson analyzes the source/cause, the intentional object, the valence (in the psychological sense of positive or negative affect), the immediate target, and the goal-directed activity and the moral value. A useful table (10.1) provides a summary of these main features (187). Among the questions he always considers is in which sense each emotion is a medial state between two extremes, as prescribed by the Aristotelian definition of virtue.

For example, chapter 3 defines gratitude as the stable emotional trait of feeling thankful in a morally justifiable way to a benefactor for a benevolently intended benefaction or favor that one would like to return, and where the feeling is mostly pleasant although it may be mixed with painful affect. Gratitude is a mean between ingratitude and obsequious gratitude. Gratitude is one of the three desert-based emotions that Kristjánsson discusses, along with jealousy (chapter 6) and grief (chapter 7). I will return to these desert-based emotions in my critical remarks.

The remaining three emotions all share the fact of being unique in some way. Pity (chapter 4) is the only emotion that is not intrinsically valuable, but only instrumental to acquiring the virtuous emotion of compassion. Shame (chapter 5) is the only exclusively self-directed emotion and, even though it is ultimately assessed as virtuous, it is seen as most appropriate in earlier developmental stages among moral learners, those who have not yet achieved "reflective, phronesis-informed virtue" (98). Awe (chapter 8) is the only emotion whose immediate target is not a person, but is transpersonal and plural, directed at ideals of beauty, truth or goodness.

The last two chapters return to more theoretical and general topics. Chapter 9 tackles emotional education. Kristjánsson compares an Aristotelian approach to six others, which he derives from a disparate literature corpus: care ethics, social and emotional learning (SEL), positive psychology, emotion-regulation discourse, academic-emotions discourse, and social intuitionism. He compares these approaches according to four criteria (see table 9.1, 165): valence of emotions to be educated, epistemological assumptions about emotion and value, general aim of emotion education, and self-related goals, that is, how emotions "impact upon moral and psychological selfhood and how they promote or undermine self-related goals" (166). Finally, he also analyzes seven specific educational strategies employed by the various approaches: behavioral strategies, cognitive and/or attentional reframing, ethos modification and emotion contagion, service learning/habituation, direct teaching, role modelling, and arts. For a summary of this analysis, see table 9.2 (176). The framework and references from this chapter will prove particularly useful not only to experts in pedagogy, but also to any teacher interested in implementing emotion education in their classroom.

Chapter 10 is aptly titled "Conclusions and Afterthoughts" and is a collection of final, somewhat sparse considerations on the virtuousness of the emotions analyzed in the book, and more generally on what makes emotions virtuous in an Aristotelian account; on the role of empirical evidence in Aristotle and in contemporary work on emotions; and on how to define and measure moral progress and development.

The book is a rich and complex exploration that rewards multiple readings, so no short synopsis could do justice to it. There are, of course, places where I disagree with the author. In particular, we disagree about the nature of jealousy and envy. According to the view that I endorse (in Protasi 2017), the crucial difference between envy and jealousy is that envy involves a perception of lack while jealousy involves a perception of loss; Kristjánsson calls this view a "very odd conceptualization" (109). We also disagree about the best way to interpret Aristotle's term "zēlos". I interpret it as one variety of envy, which I call "emulative envy" (Protasi 2016), but Kristjánsson interprets it as a distinct emotion and calls it "emulousness" or "emulation".

But those are local quarrels best left to other, more specialized, venues. Here I would like to focus on a more general aspect of Kristjánsson's approach. As I mentioned above, jealousy, gratitude, and grief all derive their virtuousness from restoring, upholding, or maintaining desert. (I should say I didn't find clear the difference between the latter two notions, but that is a minor complaint.) Kristjánsson claims that this approach is fully Aristotelian, given that "commonest moral rationale given by Aristotle is that of their instantiating the value of desert in an intrinsically Eudaimonia-constitutive way" (136). While I am not in the position to dispute the hermeneutic claim, I am worried by the consequences of letting desert play such a large role in a contemporary view of virtuous emotions.

I think it is true that humans have an emotional tendency "to find satisfaction in the consummation of just deserts" (188) and that this tendency, which Aristotle calls nemesis (poetic justice) is an important component of eudaimonia. But its importance does not imply that it ought to occupy a large role in our emotional lives. Remember the Aristotelian rule of thumb, endorsed by Kristjánsson, that in order to become virtuous and achieve a certain medial state we should push ourselves in the opposite direction to the one that we tend to lean toward. So, for instance, most people tend to indulge in sensual pleasure too much, not too little. Therefore, in order to achieve temperance, we should try to indulge in pleasure less, even if that means that, in the process of developing right habits, we sometimes end up exceeding in the direction of not sufficiently enjoying pleasures that are worthy of being appreciated. Similarly, and at a meta-level, most human beings tend to be too self-righteous, and to have a strong retributivist tendency. We are always very ready to judge others as underserving, and to rejoice in villains being punished, even before we know the whole story. We tend to lack compassion for those who have erred. Desert-based emotions easily degenerate into their excessive versions or related vices: schadenfreude, contempt, hatred, desire for revenge, or cruel punishments. Thus, I think they have to be handled with care and that we should be wary of conceiving of ethical values in general, and emotional virtues in particular, as desert-based. I will suggest a different, but complementary, approach that focuses on relationality and the expressive role of emotions.

Consider jealousy first. Kristjánsson thinks there is a fully virtuous medial state of jealousy that can be articulated in Aristotelian-friendly terms, even though Aristotle does not even mention it. Jealousy stems from the fact that a perceived benefactor (the immediate target of the emotion) favors a rival over oneself; consequently, this painful emotion motivates the agent to deprive the rival of the favoring and trying to secure it for oneself. Note that this relative favoring is cognized as undeserved, which makes jealousy a desert-based emotion whose moral value lies in the restoration of just deserts.

It seems to me, however, that whether the rival is deserving of the beloved's favor is not a necessary feature in fitting and virtuous jealousy. Imagine that I gave my younger daughter many kisses, but none to my older daughter, who then reacts with jealousy. According to Kristjánsson's account, this seems a straightforward example of virtuous jealousy, whose virtuousness is based on its demand for restoration of just deserts: both children are entitled to being loved by me in the same way, as measured by acts like kissing. While I agree that both of my children are entitled to my love, I do not think that my daughter's jealousy is virtuous insofar as she is asking me to give her what I owe her. The reason why I kiss my younger child more is because my older one actually hates to be kissed. And yet she gets jealous when I kiss her sister. My intuition is that her jealousy is nonetheless both fitting and virtuous. We can justify this intuition if we think of virtuous jealousy as expressive and constitutive of love. A 6-year-old child needs her mother to be there for her, to respond to her calls for love and attention, even if she rejects the very acts that she claims to be jealous of. That might be unfitting in an adult relationship, but it is appropriate in a child-parent one. Furthermore, it is not merely instrumentally good, but (in the right quantities) also intrinsically good: my daughter's jealousy is a component of her flourishing insofar as it is expressive of her love and need to be loved.

What counts as fitting and virtuous (in a non-desert-based way) jealousy in adult relationships will be different. Imagine that my romantic partner is with a friend when they experience something very meaningful: they happen to witness a beautiful and unexpected event. I was not entitled to sharing that experience with them; not even, I think, in some poetic justice sense (or else the meaning of justice is stretched so much it loses its usefulness). My jealousy here is expressive of my love, of my desire to share meaningful experiences with my beloved. It is fitting and it is virtuous, but not because it restores any just desert. Thinking about the expressive power of jealousy explains why many of us do like to be the object of (moderate and appropriate) jealousy: it reassures us that our beloveds love us back.[1]

An even stronger case for separating virtuousness from desert or justice can be made for another emotion completely ignored by Aristotle: grief. As Kristjánsson himself acknowledges, thinking of grief as desert-based is a particularly bold move that goes against many existing accounts. Grief is ultimately defined as being about the irretrievability of the loss of personhood of a significant other, an overall painful emotion that motivates us to commemorate the lost personhood and possibly prevent analogous losses, and whose full virtuousness lies in the value of upholding just desert. Thus, grief involves two desert-based components: one is mourning -- "We do the dead person justice by thinking well of her and honouring her reputation because she deserves it from us" (137, original emphasis) -- and the other is the desire to prevent other undeserved deaths.

Once again, and even more persuasively than with jealousy, it seems to me that grief's virtuousness lies in its expressing the value of a relationship. While we often do think of those for whom we grieve as deserving (and of their death as undeserved), that is not required for grief to be fitting and virtuous. Imagine an estranged son who finds out his abusive father is dead. Imagine him being overwhelmed with grief: he finds himself grieving for the parts of his childhood that did give him joy; he grieves for the man his father could have been and wasn't because of an addiction; he grieves for the forever-lost possibility of his father apologizing to him and making amends, feeling that forgiveness is precluded to him now. His father's memory does not deserve to be upheld, and he says that much. If he said: "he was an asshole, but I loved him and I am grieving for him", we would find his grief not only comprehensible, but fitting and actually even more noble and virtuous.

Finally let me wonder if even gratitude (the strongest case for Kristjánsson) could sometimes be virtuous without any connection to desert. Consider again the child of the abusive father. Imagine that he has overcome the trauma of abuse and is now flourishing. He has founded a charity for foster children and is able to counsel and support them thanks to his experiences. Paradoxically but -- let's assume -- correctly, he believes that his father is causally responsible for his current flourishing: he has come to realize that part of his growth and success did not only happen despite the adversities he faces, but in virtue of them. So he finds himself to be grateful toward his father. Now, one could say that this gratitude is inappropriate; the appropriate target for his gratitude should be fate or God, not his father. I am not fully convinced by this response. Once again, it seems to me that even gratitude, albeit in most cases connected to desert, is also about the bonds that tie one person to another.

Even where I am most sympathetic to Kristjánsson's outlook, then, I find myself pulling back, hesitating to give so much weight to justice, what we owe to each other, what we merit, as opposed to relationality, what we receive from each other, what we need. It is possible that such an approach would have been less congenial to the historical Aristotle, but then Kristjánsson himself is more than willing to depart from Aristotelian conclusions in order to preserve the Aristotelian process. His book is an exemplary collection of stimulating attempts to articulate the many Aristotelian . . . ish ways in which we can think of emotions as essential components of human flourishing, and I am confident its readers will learn from it as much as I did.


I am indebted to Simon Evnine, Shen-yi Liao, and Erica Stonestreet for incisive and helpful feedback on this review.


Protasi S., "Varieties of Envy", Philosophical Psychology, 29(4), 2016, pp. 535-549.

Protasi, S., "I'm Not Envious, I'm Just Jealous! On the Difference between Envy and Jealousy", The Journal of the American Philosophical Association, 3(3), 2017, pp. 313-333.

[1] While the example more naturally fits romantic monogamous relationships, I think it is possible to find a variant that works in polyamorous ones, and in friendships.