Visible Identities: Race, Gender and the Self

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Linda Martín Alcoff, Visible Identities: Race, Gender and the Self, Oxford University Press, 2006, 326pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195137353.

Reviewed by Ronald Sundstrom, University of San Francisco


Linda Martín Alcoff's book, Visible Identities, offers a conception of social identities that collects together her work on the metaphysics, epistemology, and politics of ethnicity, race, and gender. The idea of visibility has a unifying role in Alcoff's metaphysical and epistemological account of those social identities. Likewise, visible is what social identities should be in Alcoff's vision of political life. Visible identities, according to Alcoff, are a resource in a pluralistic democracy, and are not to be eschewed for a simple American identity beyond hyphens, race, ethnicity, and gender difference. That political point is the fundamental point of this book, and it is delivered through Alcoff's metaphysical analysis of race, ethnicity, and gender.

Alcoff's attempt to make a political argument through metaphysical analysis immediately calls to mind the distinction between those two areas of inquiry and their presumed separateness. Richard Rorty captured this distinction by framing it in terms of the two questions "what are we?" and "who are we?"[1] The first question is concerned with metaphysics, while the latter is political. The "who are we?" question seeks to discover some unifying thing or idea that, in Rorty's words, "makes us less like a mob and more like an army." Rorty's point, in part, was that those questions were distinct and that an answer to the first did not determine the answer to the second. Answers to the "who" question are always hopeful, for they point to not what we are but who we hope to be. Thus, the political question is a constituting one that points to an ongoing formative project, and it requires the political community to work through time to achieve their collective ideal identity.[2] Who the US should hope to be, according to Rorty, is a nation that "achieves" its constitutional ideals by learning the necessary lessons from the Civil Rights and Feminist movements, yet not losing focus on the political process of building a national moral community that takes primary pride in its collective national identity.

Alcoff would disagree with the completeness of the distinction that Rorty drew. She argues in Visible Identities that "what" we are, as well as "where" we are -- in terms of our social location -- has political implications, although not the deterministic implications that racial nationalists would desire. Furthermore, she clearly disagrees with the condition regarding identity that is required by Rorty's great left liberal hope: that strongly felt identities be put aside in favor of a unifying national identity.

Rorty assumes that strongly felt identities, such as race and ethnicity, necessarily undermine the project of achieving our nation, and that such identities contain a logic that is anti-political, in the Rawlsian sense, because they undermine the realization of an overlapping consensus. That assumption reveals why Alcoff must turn to metaphysical analysis and what she must overcome: the assumption that racial, ethnic, and gender identities are, in Arthur Schlesinger's words, disuniting America.[3]

Alcoff commences her project by reviewing the claims of liberals, political commentators and academics who espouse the hope of a unified American identity. It is useful analysis of the issues, especially as public intellectuals close to the Democratic party are reviving Rorty's and Schlesinger's anti-identity arguments, and are advocating, in the pages of the American Prospect and the New Republic, that their party should distance itself from its over-devotion to the language of "diversity" and special interest "rights" and return to the language of the "common good." She concentrates on those anti-identity objections in the first, and largest section of the book. The four chapters that make up that section are expanded versions of recent work, and take up the bulk of Visible Identities.

In Alcoff's analysis, there are three problems that these liberals (and many conservatives) have with strongly felt racial, ethnic, or gender identity. They are, respectively, the separation, reification, and reasoning problems, and each comes with its own assumptions about the nature of difference. The first is straightforward, and concerns the worry that any "strongly felt" ethnic, racial, or cultural identity harms or prevents needed national cohesion. The second problem claims that these identities reify what are really illusory categories. Furthermore, since these categories come with scripts, determined by social expectations and stereotypes, they serve to undermine individual autonomy and individually formed rational life plans. The third problem charges that strongly felt social identities interfere with rational deliberation, especially concerning political, ethical, and cultural matters. Strongly felt identities, and the expectation of loyalty and authenticity that comes with them, interferes with public reason and broader democratic deliberation. Simply put, critics charge that identity politics compels individuals to value the good of their group over that of the common good.

Alcoff responds to these problems and reveals the flaws in their related assumptions by drawing on an array of continental philosophy, hermeneutics, phenomenology, race and gender theory, and feminist epistemology to develop her own theory of identity. In Alcoff's analysis, the social identities of race, ethnicity, and gender function as interpretative horizons. They are the "situations" from which we come to know, understand, and reason about the world. Since our identities so strongly affect our interaction with the world, they cannot be so easily transcended in the way that liberals typically demand.

Secondly, for Alcoff, the identities of race and gender are embodied and visible to the world. Our experience of our identities is not as a mere concept or category; they are the experiences of our bodies in our social worlds, of our embodied visibility. Furthermore, not only do our bodies affect our experience of the world but our bodies, as marked by race and gender, also enter into the experience of others. Individuals are not interacted with merely as interlocutor, citizen, person, or human; within our social worlds persons engage others as gendered and raced beings. Located as we are within our embodied identities, it is naive for liberals to insist that individuals who recognize and seek recognition of their embodied identities are "reifying" those identities. It is worse than naive, moreover, for liberals to insist that individuals can adorn themselves with a mantle of citizenship that would cover up their embodied and visible differences. This insistence is malicious and exclusionary when it is put forward by a society that cultivates what Charles Mills called an epistemology of ignorance about the social role and presence of gender and race, and the historical place of those categories in the formation of modern liberal democracies.[4]

Alcoff introduces her conception of embodiment and visibility in the fourth chapter, "Real Identities," but she expands it in chapters six, "The Metaphysics of Gender and Sexual Difference," seven, "The Phenomenology of Racial Embodiment," and eight, "Racism and Visible Race." All of these chapters were previously published and are well-known, especially the influential seventh chapter on racial embodiment. Putting her political arguments aside, this is one of Alcoff's most important contributions to race theory. From sociological to analytic philosophical investigations about race, objectivist analyses have dominated, and have all been concerned with the social structures that make race salient in individual and group life, the level to which such human categories parallel deep biological structures, and whether those categories are in some sense real. Alcoff effectively argues that any analysis of the ontology of race, ethnicity, or gender will necessarily be incomplete without seriously considering the embodied experience of beings marked by those categories. Alcoff's correction is welcome, because one gets the sense that in much of the analytic literature about the metaphysics of race and ethnicity, those two categories are merely fascinating place holders for any social category, and the project is really about uncovering the conditions of existence for social categories generally. Alcoff's introduction of embodiment then reminds us of the specificity of the experience of each category, and the need to account for that specificity in our theories of race, ethnicity, and gender.

However, Alcoff does not seek to replace objectivist accounts of social identities with one based on hermeneutics and phenomenology; rather, she thinks that they are consistent and can be fruitfully paired. She attempts such a pairing in her sixth chapter, where she defends the controversial theory that the "objective basis of sex categories is in the differential relationship to reproductive capacity between men and women (154)." Such a controversial move is fully consistent with her conception of visible embodied identities, but it pits her against most objectivist as well as anti-objectivist accounts of gender and sex.

Other features of Alcoff's account of social identities are familiar ideas in debates about the metaphysics of social identities. She defends a dialogical account of the self that incorporates her use of hermeneutics and phenomenology, and argues that individuals participate in multiple and hybrid identities. Of course, the familiarity of the latter idea is due in no small part to the influence that her essay "Mestizo Identity" has had on race theory. That essay is renamed, "On Being Mixed," and is the twelfth chapter of Visible Identities. The upshot of these features of her account is to further weaken the three objections she analyzes, especially the assumption that such identities lead to narrow, isolated, and separated self-conceptions that undermine national political life.

Although Alcoff does present cogent answers to the three objections against identity, especially insofar as those objections are based in metaphysical and epistemological assumptions about race, ethnicity, and gender, her analysis in the fourth chapter, "Real Identities," does not address the objections of those who hold the positions of racial nominalism, skepticism, or eliminativism. At best, Alcoff demonstrates how race, ethnicity and gender are present in our lives and in society, as well as their effect on how we know the world. Her arguments, however, do not address the metaphysical arguments of those who question the objective existence of at least one of the central categories of her analysis. What she gives us is how race is experienced as real, but she has not established its reality.

The remaining sections of Visible Identities are devoted to discussions of particular identities and the detailing of her phenomenological account of racial embodiment. In addition to the chapters already mentioned, her other chapters include an analysis of the identity crisis in feminist theory, whiteness, the black-white binary, and a discussion of the debate over whether 'Latino' refers to a racial or ethnic category. Those chapters have been previously published but they have also been reworked to include her insights from the first section. Although the weight of Alcoff's analysis rests in the first section, the collection of chapters in the following sections, all of which have been previously published, are invaluable resources for scholars interested in this area of philosophy, and will be useful in classes ranging from political and social philosophy to feminist philosophy and race theory.

Alcoff's critique of the pathologization of identity not only gives a supportive analysis of "strongly felt" social identities, but also identifies the equally strongly felt desire of communities of color in the US to conserve their racial and ethnic identities, and the just-as-strong desire of many feminists to maintain their feminist identities. The desire of those communities to conserve their identities presents a challenge to those liberals who want to shift the national discussion to unity and the common good.

However, there is a tension in her work between the radical particularity of identity in her account of racial embodiment, and her account of the role of social identities within democracy. In short, I worry that Alcoff does not fully consider the incentives that social identities have to institutionalize and to form bureaucracies. This leads her to ignore the deeper concerns that critics have about identity politics as a species of special interest politics.

Alcoff's account of identity exposes important features of "visible identities" that make them radically particular experiences. While she places the social identities she analyzes within the context of group interaction, her emphasis on hybridity and multiplicity allows for enough divergence so that three problems with identity are avoided. This feature of her account is developed in her discussion of mixed race and mestizo identity. She also, however, reminds us that these complex and radically particular identities have historically served as points of political organization, and argues that they should engender larger political participation. Alcoff develops this line of thought in the first chapter, as well as in her chapters on Latino and mixed race identity. In that analysis she avoids, however, the dangers of the institutionalization of those identities, which precisely lead to critiques of identity politics. Groups become centers of power that seek social reproduction and offer measures to encourage loyalty, compel membership, and exclude those who exercise their individual autonomy by not conforming to the group's will. They seek to suppress the very multiplicity and hybridity which Alcoff depends upon to save identity from the criticisms of liberals. For the sake of their own visibility, groups engender the invisibility of other embodied identities.

This tension is especially apparent in Alcoff's discussion of mixed race identity and the black-white binary. The rise of mixed race consciousness and the claiming of the identity by an increasing number of multiracial youth, who otherwise would have been considered to be a member of "just" one race, has been met with widespread suspicion, criticism, and active opposition from such institutional forces as the NAACP and La Raza. This problem is also apparent in her discussion of the black-white binary. Within that chapter -- which is especially pertinent in the context of our present national discussions of immigration and conflicts between African Americans and Latinos -- she criticizes the unjustified focus on black and white concerns and perspectives in national discussions of race. The price of the black-white binary, according to Alcoff, is the diminishment of the rights and interests of groups outside the black-white binary, and she presents a strong argument for the abandonment of the binary in political and philosophical investigations of race and racism.

Alcoff has offered a series of arguments that race, ethnicity, and gender are visible identities that cannot simply be wished away, and should have a place in political life. Her metaphysical arguments, however, will not satisfy the political worries of the liberal critics of identity. They will still want to know how our visible identities can become properly public identities that aid us to understand and motivate us to strive for the common good. The question remains, who are we?

[1] Rorty, Richard. "'Who Are We?': Moral Universalism and Economic Triage," Diogenes 173 (1996): 5-15.

[2] Rorty, Richard. 1998. Achieving Our Country: Leftist Thought in the Twentieth-Century America. Cambridge: Harvard University Press.

[3] Schlesinger, Jr., Arthur M. 1992. The Disuniting of America: Reflections on a Multicultural Society. New York: W.W. Norton.

[4] Mills, Charles W. 1997. The Racial Contract. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.