Visual Experience: A Semantic Approach

Placeholder book cover

Wylie Breckenridge, Visual Experience: A Semantic Approach, Oxford University Press, 2018, 165pp., $54.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199600465.

Reviewed by Christopher Gauker, Universität Salzburg


The purpose of this short book is to provide a semantic analysis of sentences of the form "X looks F to S". Breckenridge says that his purpose is to explain what it means for a visual experience to have a certain character (p. 7), but the focus is really on a semantic analysis. The example that Breckenridge works with throughout is the sentence,

(1) The patch looks grey to you.

The analysis that Breckenridge arrives at is, to a first approximation, this:

(2) You have a visual experience of the patch that is occurring in way f(greyness, looking).

(Here I am combining material from p. 34 and p. 53.) The function f is a function that takes a property, such as greyness, and a kind of event, such as looking, and generates a way. In the particular case of greyness and looking,

(3) f(greyness, looking) = the way w such that it is generically true that events in which a grey thing looks are events that occur in way w.

(Here I am instantiating the general explication of f on p. 64. The odd phrase "events in which a grey thing looks" results from instantiating the variables in his formula. What he means is "looking events whose stimulus is a grey thing". Compare p. 68, where there is also a further refinement.)

Breckenridge emphasizes that the word "grey" in (1) refers to a property that physical objects have. Thus, we can say, "The patch looks grey to you and it is", in which the second clause clearly attributes the property mentioned in the first clause (p. 26). But "grey" in (1) also refers indirectly to a way. Thus we can ask how the grey patch looks to you (p. 28). Both references are possible, because "grey" refers to a property which serves as the argument of the function f, which generates a way (chapter 5).

A virtue of this account is supposed to be that it allows us to distinguish between two readings of (1). There is the reading on which the pertinent way is (a) the way the patch looks under these lighting conditions, and there is the reading on which the pertinent way is (b) the way the patch looks (simpliciter). We can draw the distinction by reading "it is generically true" in (3) as a quantifier and relativizing the quantification to a restricted domain. We get the reading with (a) when we restrict the domain to looking events in which the patch is viewed under these conditions, and we get the reading with (b) when the domain includes lookings under a wider range of conditions (p. 79). Similarly, we can distinguish two readings of "The rim of the cup looks elliptical". It is true when we quantify only over events in which two dimensional objects (viewed square on) look some way. But it is false (and "The rim of the cup looks circular" is true) when we quantify over events in which three dimensional objects look some way. (That is what Breckenridge says, but I do not understand how looking at the three-dimensional cup can occur in a way that also is the way in which looking at certain two-dimensional objects generically occurs.)

Breckenridge holds that whenever we use the sentence (1) we are referring to a maximally specific shade of grey. He says this because he wants his analysis of (1) to count as an explanation of what it is for a visual experience to have a certain character. What he actually says is that "the right sentence to use is not 'The patch looks grey to you' but 'The patch looks greyn to you', where 'greyn' is a term for exactly the right shade of grey" (p. 18). This seems to me to be an error. The normal word "grey" refers to a determinable that has many determinates. In many cases, a reference to generic grey might be just the right thing for me to say, because I cannot say more specifically how the grey patch looks. I cannot say "greyn", because I do not actually have such a term in my language. Moreover, a visual experience of a maximally specific shade of grey may be unique in history, so that the requisite quantification over events has a domain including just one thing, in which case the advantages of the theory described in the previous paragraph seem to evaporate.

Maybe Breckenridge means just that for any way of looking there is a maximally determinate way of looking that is a determinate of it. But that does not seem right either, not if we can only refer to these maximally determinate ways by referring to maximally determinate properties of the objects perceived. A visual experience cannot represent a maximally determinate shade of grey, because I may have indistinguishable visual experiences caused by various different shades of grey under various lighting conditions, which may be unknown to me, and against various background colors, which may be equally indeterminate for me. Likewise, my visual experience can rarely represent a determinate three-dimensional shape. In many of Breckenridge's own examples, such as looking tired (p. 109) or looking Lithuanian (p. 63), I cannot even imagine what a maximally determinate way would be.

Breckenridge thinks of his analysis of "looks"-sentences as supporting an adverbial theory of visual experience. Frank Jackson (1977) has objected against adverbial theories of perception generally that, since they do not refer to distinct elements of sensory experience (such as sense data), they cannot account for the difference between perceiving one thing as grey and square, on the one hand, and perceiving simultaneously one thing as grey and another thing as square, on the other (Breckenridge's example). From his answer to this objection we learn that Breckenridge really does not countenance distinct parts in a visual experience. His answer (in chapter 10) turns on his concept of maximally determinate ways of looking. A visual experience of a (nonsquare) grey rectangle and a white square has a grey way of looking and a square way of looking, but its maximally specific way of looking is not a determinate of a grey and square way of looking.

In the last chapter Breckenridge briefly addresses a puzzle about how perceptions provide a basis for knowledge. Before we can know that a thing looks F, we have to have a good deal of knowledge about which things are F. So it cannot be things' looking F that first enables us to acquire that knowledge. But, says Breckenridge, we can "discover" that things look a certain way and then discover that the things that look that way are F (p. 150). A gap in this account that Breckenridge does not fill is to explain how we conceive of these ways, if not from the start as F, and if we start with no conception of them, how they can serve as a starting point for reasoning.

In the last chapter Breckenridge also briefly discusses the question whether visual experiences have propositional content. He does not argue that they do not, but he thinks his analysis of looks statements undermines one argument for thinking that they do. The argument to be undermined begins with the observation that X's looking F to S is a reason, however weak, for S to believe that X is F. From that it is inferred that the looking and the belief must both have propositional content. Breckenridge thinks his analysis of "looks"-sentences undermines this argument by giving us another way of understanding how visual experiences can justify beliefs. Just as the fact that John is walking as if he has a sore foot can justify us in believing that John has a sore foot without his walking representing anything, so too the fact that the patch looks grey can justify us in believing that the patch is grey without its representing that the patch is grey. Well, that's a good point, but I think his opponents (whom he does not identify) will reply that their assumption is not that the fact that X looks F to S justifies S's belief that X is F; rather, it is that X's looking F to S justifies S's belief that X is F. (For an account of the state of play, see Gauker 2018.) The case of walking is different, for while the fact that John is walking in a certain way may justify certain conclusions about John, it is not his walking in that way that justifies those conclusions.

The primary work that Breckenridge's analysis does is in telling us how the word "grey" functions in (1) -- that it refers directly to a property and indirectly to a way -- and in introducing a quantification in the analysis that we can exploit in various explanations (see above). But in one important way the analysis is under-informative. The analysis aims to tell us what an expression like "grey" is doing in specifying a looking event. But in giving that analysis, Breckenridge writes, in (3), of "looks" that "occur in way w". We are not told anything about what it means to say, in the analysis, that a look occurs in way w. A look is a visual experience, but what is that? And what does it mean for one of them to occur in a way that can be referred to, indirectly, via a generic truth about just such a way, with a word for a property of physical objects, such as "grey"? Might it be that the pertinent way can be referred to with "grey" because that way is a way of representing the property of being grey? A semantic analysis need not be a metaphysical analysis. We complete our semantic account of the meaning of "dog" when we say that it denotes the property of being a dog; we do not need to go on to say what a dog is. But if the semantic analysis of "looks F" stops where Breckenridge stops, then a purely semantic account will not help us much with the burning issues in the philosophy of perception.

There are other things that one might have expected from a book with this topic that it does not do. Apart from Jackson's objection to adverbial theories, Breckenridge does not address anything that anyone else has ever said on the topics of visual experience or verbs of perception. Breckenridge cites as precedents but does not discuss the earlier adverbial theories of perception, such as Tye's (1984). Breckenridge sometimes argues in a linguistic way, by comparing sentences of various forms, and he is concerned to show that his theory can accommodate various complements after "looks" (ch. 8). But there is no serious linguistics here, by which I mean an attempt to place the analysis of "looks"-sentences in the context of a more general treatment of adverbs and of perception verbs, both in English and other languages. Although he rests a lot on the idea that there is a generic quantification in the analysis of (1), he does not offer a serious account of generics and cites only one piece of literature on this topic.

On a cursory reading, one might think that Breckenridge's book does not deal with many of the burning issues in the philosophy of perception. Actually, it does touch on many of them in one way or another. Moreover, one can appreciate the carefulness and deliberateness with which Breckenridge develops his thesis. But because he does not tell us what the connection is between a property and a way of looking like a thing that has that property, he has left untouched the crucial thing we want to know about the meaning of "The patch looks grey".


Gauker, Christopher, 2018: "Do Perceptions Justify Beliefs? The Argument from 'Looks' Talk", in Johan Gersel, Rasmus Thybo Jensen, Morten S. Thaning and Søren Overgaard, eds., In the Light of Experience: Essays on Reason and Perception, Oxford University Press, pp. 141-160.

Jackson, Frank, 1977: Perception: A Representative Theory, Cambridge University Press.

Tye, Michael, 1984: "The Adverbial Approach to Visual Experience," The Philosophical Review 93: 195-225.