Visual Phenomenology

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Michael Madary, Visual Phenomenology, MIT Press, 2016, 247pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780262035453.

Reviewed by Susanna Siegel, Harvard University


The central thesis of this book is that "visual perception is an ongoing process of anticipation and fulfillment." Madary calls this conclusion "AF", and the book is organized around a two-premise argument for it:

P1. The phenomenology of vision is best described as an ongoing process of anticipation and fulfillment.

P2. There are strong empirical reasons to model vision using the general form of anticipation and fulfillment.

Conclusion (AF): Visual perception is an ongoing process of anticipation and fulfillment.

Madary devotes Part I to defending phenomenological analyses of the dynamic and perspectival aspects of visual experience that he takes to support premise 1, and Part II to summarizing strands in vision science that he takes to support premise 2. These strands emphasize predictive processing and relationships of various kinds between perception and action. Part III makes the case that the phenomenological and scientific considerations converge by independently supporting (AF), and that taken together they "harmonize subjective and objective ways of investigating the mind" by showing that both visual experience and visual processing are structured in the same way (92, 157-8). The book ends with a helpful appendix highlighting the roots of Madary's notions of anticipation and fulfillment in Husserl's framework of future-directed protentions and fulfillments, and explaining where his notions and Husserl's diverge.

This book is a pleasure to read. The sharply focused narrative is packed with engaging discussions of a wide range of topics relating to visual perception, including its perspectival and temporal aspects, peripheral vision, phenomenal overflow, the puzzle of the speckled hen, perceptual constancies, blurred vision, the attentional blink, dual-stream processing, change-blindness, akinetopsia, the admissible contents of experience, confidence in perception, sensory-motor contingencies, social perception, various kinds of perceptual indeterminacy, and multiple kinds of horizons defined by Husserl.

How exactly do anticipations and fulfillments structure visual experience, according to Madary? He seems to intend the ordinary meaning of "anticipation" rather than a specialized one, since anticipations as a type of state are never given a special definition. Visual anticipations, which are distinct from beliefs (53), are "anticipations of how factual properties [of things you're currently seeing] will appear in the immediate future" (39). Factual properties are "properties [of external things] that can in principle be perceived from many perspectives" (28). Volumetric properties such as being spherical are factual properties, as are sortal kind properties such as being a vase, and social kinds such as being a baseball game.

For instance, suppose you see a vase and from your current viewpoint its facing surfaces look smooth, green, and convex. Alongside these properties, there is another aspect to the way it looks, according to Madary, and that aspect is reflected in your anticipations of how its shape would look from other perspectives. Adapting a proposal of Siegel (2010), Madary argues that visual experience has contents characterized by conditionals of the following form, where S is the subject of the experience (presented under a first-person mode of presentation), and o is an object S sees:

(PC') If S substantially changes her perspective on o, her visual phenomenology will present different views of o's factual properties.

Visual anticipations include visual experiences with contents of the form (PC'), which stands for "perspectival connectedness" (42). (PC') is formulated in terms of seeing an object o, but Madary intends an interpretation on which the conditional can be true even in cases of hallucination in which there is no object seen (63). It might at first seem natural to interpret (PC') as an expectation about which properties a thing one is seeing will look to have. But according to Madary, what's anticipated are subsequent experiences, rather than states of things in the world outside the mind (158).

In addition to having (PC') contents, visual anticipations also have contents that specify perspectival changes and their phenomenological effects more exactly. For instance, suppose you have just walked around the vase. Your visual anticipations have content (PC'). But assuming that you have retained what the backside of the vase looks like, on Madary's view, you also more specifically anticipate what the backside looks like from the perspective you just occupied. And he thinks you might harbor such specific anticipations, even if you hadn't just seen the other side of the vase. So visual anticipations include both visual experiences with contents (PC'), and visual experiences with conditional contents much like (PC') that specify more exactly what the other perspectives and views are. Madary suggests that these more specific contents "escape complete verbal characterization" (62) and he does not characterize them explicitly.

Visual anticipations are one half of the structure of visual experience, and fulfillments are the other half. Fulfillments are visual experiences that match what was visually anticipated at an earlier moment. If you visually anticipate that there's a miniature city on the backside of the vase you are now seeing, then your anticipation is fulfilled if you have a subsequent experience as of the back of the vase with a miniature city attached to it -- even if that experience is an illusion or hallucination (63). More soberly, if you visually anticipate that the color and texture of the back of the vase is continuous with its front, then your anticipations are fulfilled if you go on to have experiences with the anticipated contents.

Fulfillment therefore differs from accuracy about things in the external world. Whether an experience fulfills anticipations depends exclusively on whether its contents were projected in anticipation, not on how things are in the world outside the experience. (Madary is working in a framework that rejects the naïve realist individuation of some experiences by the objects and properties perceived (71)). Fulfillments have external-world accuracy conditions, but those accuracy conditions are not fulfillment-conditions.

Thesis (AF) makes a claim about the structure of visual experiences. The experiences whose structure it purports to exhaustively characterize are temporally extended. Madary criticizes philosophers who are accustomed to abstracting from the dynamic features of perceptual experience, and unaccustomed to treating temporally extended, dynamically changing experiences, as units of analysis. To those philosophers, Madary's analysis might sound like a claim about sequences of experiences, each of which has its own (PC') content (or a more specific version of it), rather than a claim about the content of a unified temporally extended experience.

Since Madary relies on the argument in Siegel (2010), concluding that momentary experiences have conditional contents closely related to (PC'), he seems to tacitly acknowledge contents of momentary experiences, as well as contents of temporally extended experiences. Momentary experiences would include among their contents (PC') and analogous conditionals with more specific antecedents and consequents. Madary makes clear that contents that characterize factual properties (such as being a vase) belong only to temporally extended experiences, according to Madary (61). These temporally extended experiences are normally built from fulfillments. In the course of unfolding anticipations and fulfillments, one normally experiences the vase from multiple perspectives, and correctly anticipates what it would look like from those perspectives before one saw it.

Philosophers who say (or presume) that momentary experiences can have contents attributing factual properties are therefore making a mistake, if Madary is right. In the case of sortal kinds, for example, it's temporally extended experiences, not momentary ones, that have sortal kind contents. On his view, the temporarily extended experiences have sortal kind contents by virtue of having contents that characterize a range of perspectives. Properties such as being a vase are presented in visual experience by virtue of anticipations of what experiencing a vase from different perspectives is like.

Madary's conceit is that a single kind of anticipation and fulfillment structures visual phenomenology and applies to sub-personal processing as well. He highlights strands in vision science that claim that visual processing is "future-directed" in that it uses stored information to "predict" how things are in the environment. He claims that several incarnations of this idea "suggest something like premise 2", including Helmholtz's analysis of perceptions as the result of unconscious inference, Jerome Bruner's "New Look" account of motivated seeing, and Gregory's analysis of perceptions as hypotheses (104). Like these views, thesis (AF) entails that the states the perceiver is in normally influence subsequent perceptions.

Even if these views agree with thesis (AF) that the psychological precursors of experience can influence their contents, they don't provide any independent support for the framework of anticipation and fulfillment. That's because visual anticipations, as Madary initially characterizes them, don't map directly onto any relation of influence between prior expectations or desires and subsequent perceptions.

Consider Helmholtz's idea that stored information that light comes from above influences the interpretation of information about surfaces delivered by early vision, often producing a visual experience of a convex surface rather than a concave one. The stored assumption might be a visual anticipation (the visual system "expects" light to come from above). But the anticipation that light comes from above is not, in any straightforward sense, fulfilled, since one need not end up with a fresh visual representation that light comes from above after encountering a stimulus that one ends up perceiving as convex, as a result of inferring it from the assumption that light comes from above together with other information. Rather than fulfilling any anticipation, the light-comes-from-above prior in Helmholtz's picture is simply retained.

Helmholtz's stored assumption that light comes above might be an anticipation in Madary's sense. But the experiments by Bruner that Madary cites (and which have been roundly criticized) would not support the framework of anticipation and fulfillment, even if they succeeded in showing what Bruner claimed they show: that impoverished children visually overestimate the size of coins more than wealthy children do due to their desires.[1] Even if Bruner's experiments had succeeded, they wouldn't show that children anticipate the size of the coins.

Madary claims to find stronger support for (AF) in contemporary models according to which the visual system processes information in accordance with Bayes' theorem. According to Madary, these models offer "functional-level descriptions of visual anticipation" (95). The sub-personal version of visual anticipations would be anticipations of subsequent sub-personal states of the visual system, rather than generalizations (such as that light comes from above) that are projected to hold into the future. If the visual system entered the states that were anticipated, the anticipations would be sub-personally fulfilled.

But there's reason to doubt that there is any systematic structural correspondence of the sort Madary claims to find between these sub-personal states and person-level anticipations and fulfillments (157). The phenomenological analysis Madary uses to defend premise 1 focuses on the course of anticipation and fulfillment, not on any causal role by which anticipations bring about fulfillments. By contrast, according to the Bayesian approaches that Madary says give the strongest support for Premise 2, experiences arise as the result of inferences. And inferential processes are causal processes. So if the functional profile sketched by the Bayesian defenses matched the relationship between personal-level anticipations and fulfillments, then those anticipations would cause their own fulfillments, in the way that premises cause conclusions in inference.

There's reason to doubt that anticipations cause fulfillments. Even if you correctly anticipate that the back of the vase will look smooth, it is doubtful that your anticipation of what you will see if you look behind the vase causes the experiences you have if you actually look behind it. The fact that the smooth surface you find matches your expectation is simply due to the fact that you knew what to anticipate. It's the smooth surfaces, not your anticipation of them, that cause the visually fulfilling experience of smooth surfaces (skeptical worries aside). Your experience does not owe its occurrence to your familiarity with such ordinary objects. What it owes to your anticipation it simply its status as a visual fulfillment. In cases like these, anticipations do not explain their own fulfillment.

One might try to reply on Madary's behalf that the sub-personal structure of anticipation and fulfillment gives us reason to think that, at the personal level, your anticipation of the smooth surface on the back of the vase does, after all, explain why you experience it as smooth when you peer behind it. But this reply is at odds with the dialectic as Madary presents it. He makes the case for Premise 1 on purely phenomenological grounds, and these grounds are meant to be independent of the grounds for Premise 2 (156). In addition, his phenomenological case for Premise 1 focuses only on the fact (as he sees it) that anticipations are normally fulfilled ("visual experiences are an ongoing process of anticipation and fulfillment"), not on any causal relationships that would give anticipations a major role in explaining why or how they normally lead to their own fulfillment.

Madary's overarching argument aims at consilience between visual processing and visual phenomenology. Anticipation and fulfillment are said to be a single pair of notions that apply both to conscious experience and the subpersonal processing that underlies it, and these notions are said to illuminate a functional isomorphism between the structures of visual phenomenology and visual processing. Although I found myself doubtful that Madary's case for thesis (AF) can "overcome the historical tension between subjective and objective methods of investigating the mind" (156), the book is a stimulating, fresh, and illuminating treatment of many topics in the philosophy of perception.


Balcetis, E. and Dunning, D. (2010) Wishful seeing: More desired objects are seen as closer. Psychological Science 21, 147-152.

Erdelyi, M.H. (1974). A new look at the new look: Perceptual defense and vigilance. Psychological Review, 81, 1-25.

McCurdy, H.G. (1956). Coin perception studies and the concept of schemata. Psychological Review, 63, 160-168.

Siegel, S. (2010) The Contents of Visual Experience. Oxford University Press.

[1] Some criticisms include Erdelyi (1974) and McCurdy (1956). Recent revivals of the New Look methods such as Balcetis and Dunning 2009 explicitly try to improve on Bruner’s methods.