Visual Thinking in Mathematics: An Epistemological Study

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Marcus Giaquinto, Visual Thinking in Mathematics: An Epistemological Study, Oxford University Press, 2007, 287pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199285945.

Reviewed by Sun-Joo Shin, Yale University


This book takes up an extremely interesting topic: the epistemic role of visual thinking in mathematical practice. By 'visual thinking,' Giaquinto means our cognitive activities involving either internal or external diagrams. Even more interestingly, it reaches the following controversial conclusion: Mathematical knowledge is synthetic a priori. The project is provocative, especially to philosophers, not only as an attempt at a revival of Kant's mysterious territory but also in the intriguing connection between the defense of Kant's old view and recent interdisciplinary research on diagrammatic reasoning. I take this to be the most creative and valuable part of the book, and hence, the success of the project heavily depends on whether the relation between Kant's synthetic a priori and visual thinking is persuasive. Full disclosure: In "Kant's syntheticity revisited by Peirce" I argued that the synthetic a priori nature Kant assigned to mathematics corresponds to crucial steps in mathematical reasoning. In addition, I have worked on diagrammatic reasoning (The Logical Status of Diagrams and The Iconic Logic of Peirce's Graphs). Not having made a connection between these two projects, I personally welcome Giaquinto’s project with enthusiasm.

I, however, easily imagine an objection to my value judgment about the project. First, pointing out that Euclidean geometry was the main model of Kant's mathematics, the skeptics would argue that the relation between Kant's view and visual reasoning is not difficult to notice. What's worse, Kant's synthetic thesis on mathematics is proven to be false, the objectors would continue, citing advances made in logic and mathematics after Kant, e.g., the development of non-Euclidean geometries, the arithmetization of geometry, the axiomatization of arithmetic, and predicate logic. Facing such skepticism, I would defend the current project mainly for two reasons: (i) The scope of visual thinking in the book covers much larger ground than the use of diagrams in Euclidean geometry and extends to arithmetic. (ii) The meaning of the 'synthetic a priori' might be different between Kant and post-Kantians (mainly due to the advances made after Kant), but that does not mean Kant's hunch about the special nature of mathematics is totally wrong.

Giaquinto’s project is ambitious not only in its claims but also in the ground he covers in the eleven main chapters. Starting from geometrical examples, he moves to arithmetic, provides discussions of analysis and calculus, and touches on general issues related to visual thinking. I find the first of the three parts of the book (chapters 2-5) to be crucial for the main thesis of the book even though the rest of the book also provides further useful discussions.

The four chapters on geometry can be considered as a case study for the role of visual thinking in basic concepts, basic knowledge, discovery, and proofs in geometry, respectively. After arguing in Chapter 2 that a basic geometric concept of 'square' is formed out of a perceptual concept, Giaquinto shows in Chapter 3 that this perceptual concept is the basis of geometrical knowledge that "A square is symmetric in terms of its diagonal." In the next chapterhe explores how a geometric discovery about squares -- i.e. "Given a square, say c, the area of c is twice as big as c', where c' is a square formed by the midpoints of the four sides of c" -- is made by relying on the way a diagram is drawn. In Chapter 5, Giaquinto gives an analysis of a geometric diagram-based proof of the proposition "When drawing a semi-circle for a given diameter CD, an angle CAD (where A is a point on the semi-circle) is the right angle."

Without going into detail, the reader can easily imagine how a diagram is being used in each case. Giaquinto takes two further steps from the existing view that the role of visual thinking is purely heuristic and/or psychological: First, he attempts to show that in each case the use of diagrams is epistemically legitimate so that the belief obtained in terms of visual thinking is knowledge. (Let me call this the 'knowledge thesis.') I think this step, if successful, knocks down a prejudice against diagrams which exists in mathematical practice. Second, the role of diagrams is epistemically so crucial and unique that the mathematical knowledge obtained visually becomes synthetic a priori, as Kant claimed. (Let me call this the 'Kantian thesis.')

When the knowledge thesis is presented (e.g. pp. 40-43), the reader runs into an interesting assumption Giaquinto makes about mathematical knowledge: that the justification of mathematical knowledge is similar to the justification of empirical knowledge. Not everybody would accept this assumption, and many would demand a different kind of justification for mathematical knowledge, other than the reliability, rationality, and justification that are appropriate for empirical knowledge. This is where many would bring in the analytic/synthetic and/or the a priori/a posteriori distinction, arguing for fundamental differences between mathematical versus empirical knowledge. Does Giaquinto truly believe that the mathematical belief obtained using a diagram becomes knowledge because the process passes tests for reliability, rationality and justification? Don't we need an independent proof to show that the process we are taking using a diagram is legitimate? Doesn't the existence of a proof show that we have a system (either symbolic or diagrammatic)? If so, the reliability, rationality, and justification criteria would be easily satisfied by proving the soundness of the system (not case by case as Giaquinto tries to do here). Giaquinto might defend his criteria on the ground that the mathematical knowledge formed out of visual thinking is not analytic or not system-relative, but synthetic. If so, we realize that his knowledge thesis assumes part of his Kantian thesis. Hence, let me suggest that we hold off any decisive evaluation about the knowledge thesis until we examine his Kantian thesis.

The main reason for the non-analyticity, that is, syntheticity, of mathematical knowledge, according to Giaquinto, is that it is not purely obtained by the analysis of concepts, but by using a diagram:

[I]t is clear that this way [visual thinking] of reaching the belief does not involve unpacking definitions, conceptual analysis, or logical deduction. Hence it must count as non-analytic. (p. 47)

There is no analysis of meanings, and no deduction from definitions in the process. In philosophers' jargon the process is … not analytic; rather it consists in the operation of a synthesis of visually triggered belief-forming dispositions. (p. 67)

According to Giaquinto, the beliefs or discoveries based on diagrams do not rely on the analysis of concepts or deduction, which is why they are not analytic, period. Is it so? It would be an important and interesting task to explain why Giaquinto believes that using a diagram makes the process non-analytic, but instead Giaquinto assumes that conceptual analysis and logical deduction belong only to symbolic thinking. (By 'symbolic thinking' we mean cognitive activities involving symbols.) I am afraid this assumption undermines the entire project in a severe way.

First of all, the assumption that logical deduction must be symbolic confirms the root of the existing prejudice against visual thinking: Symbolic systems are the only kind of logical systems, and hence, diagrams are limited to being heuristic tools. Since Giaquinto grants the 'rule-guided formal manipulation' exclusive to symbolic thinking, the logical status of visual thinking is hard to understand. It is not clear to me why he assumes that deduction takes place only in symbolic systems. Toward the end of Chapter 5, he mentions a formal diagrammatic system FG as an example where diagrams can be used as a formal proof: "[T]he derivation gives a fair representation of the visual steps one might take in following Euclid's own argument" (p. 84). I am not sure what the author would say about the status of the conclusion in the system FG. Is it synthetic since diagrams are used? Or, is it analytic since it is derived in the formal system? I wish Giaquinto had taken full of recent work on formal diagrammatic systems both in logic and in computer science.

For argument's sake, suppose that using diagrams is not conceptual analysis and, hence, non-analytic. Then, when we convert a given diagram-based proof into a purely symbolic proof (or vice versa), does the same conclusion change its status from synthetic truth to analytic truth (or vice versa)? For example, when Hilbert axiomatized the Euclidean geometry, did he change the status of Euclidean theorems from synthetic to analytic statements? I highly doubt that. On the other hand, some might draw attention to the conjecture that there would have been no Kantian mathematical syntheticity if Hilbert's arithmetic axiomatization had been available to Kant, and might further argue for the connection between the adoption of diagrams and non-analyticity. Even so, I do not think that we would like to say one and the same proposition has two different kinds of status, synthetic or analytic, depending on the way one arrives at the proposition. Rather, it has been claimed that Kant wrongly believed those propositions are synthetic because of the unavailability of arithmetization. This is the beginning of the time-honored long, and complicated, debate on the origin of Kant's syntheticity among philosophers, and I am quite surprised that Giaquinto does not acknowledge the different views of Kant's syntheticity. Instead, he seems to take Kant's 'analytic' simply as the containment relation (p. 123). In the case of Kant, there is a better excuse for Giaquinto's simple and unclear use of 'analyticity': Kant was born before the era of predicate logic and the axiomatization of arithmetic.

I find Giaquinto's defense of the other half of the Kantian thesis, the a priori nature of mathematical knowledge obtained by visual thinking, even more puzzling. The claim, based on the use of diagrams, that geometrical knowledge is synthetic does not mean, he argues, that knowledge based on visual perception is dependent on experience since "the visual experience serves merely to trigger certain belief-forming dispositions" (p. 44). What does 'belief-forming dispositions' mean? Giaquinto spells it out:

On my account a visual experience causes the belief, but does not play the role of reasons or grounds for the belief, as it is not necessary to take the experience to be veridical… . [T]he visual experience is used neither as evidence nor as a way of recalling past experiences for service as evidence… . So this way of acquiring the belief is a priori, as it does not involve the use of experience as evidence. (p. 44)

The a priori nature of mathematical discovery is defended in a similar way: "In view of its non-evidential role we can say that visualizing in this case is part of an a priori means of acquiring belief" (p. 67). What does the 'non-evidential' role exactly mean? Does this mean that visual thinking is, again, only heuristic? If so, the author's project would not be news at all. What's more puzzling is the jump from the visual thinking involved being non-evidential to the conclusion obtained being a priori. Again, there would be plenty of room to argue that visual thinking is only a convenient tool to get to an a priori statement, and hence, visual thinking is irrelevant to the justification for the Kantian thesis. I strongly doubt that this is what the author would like to admit. It is somewhat odd that the author did not bring in Kant's reason for the a priori (i.e. empirical non-falsification) as he did for the syntheticity, especially when many believe that Kant's a priori is less controversial than Kant's syntheticity.

After I pointed out that Giaquinto's criteria for mathematical knowledge obtained by visual thinking are similar to the criteria for empirical knowledge, I asked that we withhold judgment until we found out what the author thinks mathematical knowledge is. Giaquinto wants to believe that mathematical knowledge is a priori, i.e. does not rely on experiences. If so, our previous objection that a priori mathematical knowledge should have different criteria than empirical knowledge, that is, more than reliability and rationality, stands. Hence, neither the knowledge thesis nor the Kantian thesis (both of which are central claims of his project) seems to be well-argued for.

In chapters 6-8, where the topic is arithmetic, the extension of 'visual thinking' becomes broader, extending, for example, to images that are more or less mental. It is praiseworthy that Giaquinto makes an effort to conduct interdisciplinary research on the topic by bringing in Kosslyn's seminal work. I wish the author had mentioned (even briefly) the imagery debate between Kosslyn and Pylyshyn to explain the relation between imagery and picture-like entities. This is why things could get tricky when we include internal diagrams in the discussion. As far as the discussions on geometry from chapters 2-5 go, talking about external diagrams is enough, but when Giaquinto moves on to mental number lines, internal diagrams get into the picture (as it were), and so does the imagery debate.

Chapter 8 handles a well-known important issue, i.e. particularity (p.141): How can we justify the move from a particular example to a general truth? The objection is directly related to the Locke/Berkeley debate on particular triangles versus triangles in general, and I am somewhat surprised that Giaquinto postponed the issue until visualization in arithmetic, except in a couple of sentences on pp. 38-39. His long discussion of the particularity objection in Chapter 8 (pp. 141-159) boils down to this: As long as we don't fall into accidental properties of particular images which convey information, our prior knowledge will guide us in how to manipulate them so that we may arrive at a new piece of knowledge. This is a somewhat long-winded way of saying how a representation system works, even though I do not think the author had that in mind. The semantics of a system tells us what an item represents (i.e. 'vehicles of information' (p. 158)), and the transformation rules tell us how to manipulate it to obtain a new item (i.e. the transformation discussion on p. 156 and the operation on items on p. 158). A clearer understanding of formal diagrammatic systems could have got us to the point in a quicker way.

Giaquinto's distinction between concept-driven symbol manipulation and rule-driven symbol manipulation in Chapter 10 is another place where his lack of a clear concept of a representation system, especially a diagrammatic system, hurts his project. The rules of a representation system are invented so that the user can perform desirable manipulations more mechanically and more efficiently (pp. 210-211). However, the rules of a sound system are not arbitrary but based on concepts or the meanings of symbols of the system. A similar remark can be applied to Giaquinto’s formal versus informal symbol manipulation. More importantly, much of the discussion (e.g. the last paragraph of p. 196) does not have to be limited to symbolic systems but can be applied to diagrammatic systems.

Another issue in Chapter 10 is the status of visual thinking with symbols. At the beginning of the book, visual thinking involves internal or external diagrams, but in this chapter symbols are not excluded from visual thinking. It is not clear to me where Chapter 10 stands in the overall project, even though the chapter could make an interesting paper by itself. On the other hand, the author might have had in mind the last chapter of the book when the meaning of 'visual thinking' is changed toward the end of the book. Chapter 12 raises skepticism toward a clear dichotomy between algebraic (or symbolic) versus geometric (spatial) thinking and between thinking with diagrams and thinking with symbols, arguing that these classifications come in a spectrum. I find the idea insightful and welcome the author's emphasis on various features (pp. 248-249) as constructive. The list on p. 249, I am afraid, shows, again, the author's neglect of the existence of diagrammatic representation systems. Having syntax and carrying precise information (the second and the third features listed under symbolic representation on p. 249) are requirements for a representation system, either symbolic or diagrammatic.

The author shows great ambition in tackling such an interesting topic with an interdisciplinary spirit. More familiarity with the existing literature about Kant's views on mathematics could help the book’s main thesis about the epistemic role of visual thinking. More importantly, I believe a deeper understanding of diagrammatic systems or representation system in general could lend the project some much needed clarity.