Visual Versions

Placeholder book cover

Robert Schwartz, Visual Versions, MIT Press, 2006, 265pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 0262693348.

Reviewed by C. L. Hardin, Syracuse University


Wittgenstein famously remarked that philosophy is language gone on holiday. In common speech, context, along with our intentions and standards of correctness (often tacit), typically makes our references clear and our assertions testable. But when we abstract from these factors, as philosophers often do, the grasp that we have on our concepts becomes shaky. We fall victim to ambiguity, obscurity, and paradox.

Philosophers are not alone. In this nice collection of essays, Robert Schwartz shows how visual psychologists overlook context and purpose at their peril. Disputes that seem intractable frequently involve insufficiently examined assumptions. Take for example the matter of perceptual inference in vision, discussed in Chapters 6 and 8. On one end, Nature presents the perceiver with an array of receptoral excitations, and on the other end the human organism arrives at a representation of a world of enduring objects. Something is given, something is inferred. But how is this process to be understood? Schwartz delineates five different ways that the given and the inferred have been distinguished. The first has it that sensation is given, whereas perception is the result of inference. According to the second, the given requires no learning, but that which is inferred does. For the third way, impoverished stimuli are given and the perceiving organism provides the elaboration. In the case of the fourth way, the given is the outcome of purely physiological operations that must be processed mentally (understood broadly to include computations) in order to arrive at a proper representation. The fifth approach is epistemological: the given is what is directly or immediately perceived, and the rest must be inferred.

These classifications are cross-cutting, and only confusion can result from conflating them. Moreover, in each case it is difficult to make a clean division between the given, however construed, and the processes that give rise to representations of the world of objects. Schwartz offers us a detailed discussion of the controversy over whether visual perception is direct or indirect. He notes the interesting fact that the proponents of both sides argue that the central theses of their opponents are either implausible or without content. Yet, at the same time, both sides have made valuable empirical contributions to our understanding of how perception takes place. Here is indeed an antinomy to make Kant smile. Schwartz' diagnosis is that the terms of the debate have become detached from their empirical moorings. The remedy he proposes is reminiscent of Kant: renounce the grand debate, and pay attention to the problem of the detailed workings of informational pickup.

We have just alluded to "a world of enduring objects" whose representation is to be the goal of perception. But what, exactly, is to count as an object? And when, in the course of cognitive development, do children come to have the concept of an object? Schwartz provides us with a quasi-Quinean discussion of these questions that indicates how problematic they really are. Here is one of his conclusions in Chapter 10:

Mapping the course of development of vision and cognition from birth thereon has intrinsic interest. Attempting to determine when the concept of an "object" makes its first appearance, founders on the fact that there is no unique concept sanctioned either by ordinary use or present scientific theory.

Once again, the problem is that a key concept is being used without a set of clear principles or practices to guide its application.

Chapters 13 and 14 are devoted to perceptual error, particularly error in achromatic color perception. It is often assumed that the chief business of the color perception system (chromatic or achromatic) is to detect color. Schwartz calls this the measuring instrument conception of color perception. According to this conception, an error is a misestimation of the actual reflectance of the perceived surface. But our visual systems are not in fact good at estimating absolute values of reflectances, although they are quite skilled at discerning reflectance differences, which are so important in the contest between predator and prey.  So errors from the point of view of reductive physicalism need not count as errors in the life-tasks of the organism. There is thus more than one way to be right about judgments of achromatic color perception and, correspondingly, more than one way to get them wrong.

Schwartz distinguishes R (reflectance) and L (looks) tasks and their corresponding R- and L-errors. Both have their uses in psychophysics; at a minimum, even if one holds the dubious assumption that the business of the achromatic visual system is to detect reflectances, one would like to appeal to the outcome of L-tasks such as sample matching to understand why people make the R-errors that they do. It is intuitively easy to understand, at least roughly, what an error in a judgment of reflectance amounts to, although even here Schwartz has his caveats.  But how are we to determine that an error of appearance has been made? Not surprisingly, Schwartz' answer is that we must appeal to a standard set of conditions as well as to a standard observer. It turns out that the choice of a set of standard conditions is to some extent arbitrary, and in any case may not correspond well with natural viewing conditions. Variability among normal observers will also be a problem, although less likely to be as much of an issue as it is in chromatic color perception with its extra level of complexity.

Chapters 6, 7, and 8 are concerned with a different though by no means unrelated set of issues, those turning around picture perception. Two competing paradigms of pictorial representation are at stake here: the projective, or resemblance, view, and the symbolic view. The former holds that seeing pictures calls upon nothing more than the same processes and mechanisms as ordinary seeing. The latter maintains that picture perception requires forms of cognition akin to those involved in interpreting texts. Schwartz argues for the symbolic paradigm in two stages. The first is by way of criticizing the resemblance view, which seems initially the more plausible of the two competitors. The principal difficulty the resemblance account faces is that we have a robust recognition of pictures even though they may be distorted or stylized in a wide variety of ways. The main problem facing the symbolic account is that realistic pictures do not seem to involve any interpretation; they are simply seen. There are many strands to be untangled in this controversy. Schwartz makes a number of suggestions that favor the symbolic view. Chief among them is the thought that interpretation need be neither conscious nor learned, and that the reasons for thinking there to be no clear boundary between the given and the inferred, between direct and indirect perception, have considerable force here as well.

The first five chapters of the book contain discussions of Berkeleian themes mostly drawn from the New Theory of Vision. Schwartz' approach is to connect Berkeley's thought to current work on vision, largely to Berkeley's advantage. His reading of the New Theory blunts much of the criticism others have directed against Berkeley's theory of signs, and indeed finds his motor theory of spatial perception to be surprisingly close to Gibson's, especially when the direct/indirect perception dichotomy is drawn into question. Spatial perception is the topic of chapters 1 and 2. Chapters 3 and 4 are concerned with the qualitative aspects of perception and contain a nice examination of sensory ordering. These help to set the stage for the discussion in chapter 5, on the Molyneaux problem, which I found particularly instructive.

There are three issues of detail I would like to raise with Schwartz' treatment of sensory ordering. The first is that, contrary to what Schwartz and many other writers assert, the qualities of sounds are not exhausted by pitch, loudness and timbre, any more than color qualities are exhaustively characterizable by brightness (or lightness), saturation and hue. In the case of colors, contrast conditions can require other dimensions such as fluorence. And sounds under natural conditions, when we use two ears, have a spatial quality. They are localizable not only in azimuth but, surprisingly, in altitude as well. My second quarrel has to do with the use of Berkeley's minimum sensible as a metric for a subjective order. The size of a minimum sensible varies with viewing conditions such as illumination and retinal locus as well as task. Yet the apparent size of phenomenal objects -- the proportion of the visual field that they occupy -- does not change accordingly. My third objection is to the use of "just noticeable differences" as a measure of color quality distance. The literature shows unequivocally that small color differences do not sum linearly to yield large color differences. Furthermore, if other principles are used for color scaling, such as, in the Natural Color System, the degree of resemblance to unique hues, the number of steps from one color to another is quite different from that yielded by the equal hue interval scaling of the Munsell System. In all of these respects, Schwartz needs to be even more of a pluralist!

All in all, this is a provocative set of essays that ought to be read by those who are too comfortable with the usual ways of thinking about perception.