Vitalism and the Scientific Image in Post-Enlightenment Life Science, 1800-2010

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Sebastian Normandin and Charles T. Wolfe (eds.), Vitalism and the Scientific Image in Post-Enlightenment Life Science, 1800-2010, Springer, 2013, 377pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400724440.

Reviewed by Jane Maienschein, Arizona State University


This volume is the second in a new series on History, Philosophy and Theory of the Life Sciences, edited by Charles T. Wolfe, Philippe Huneman, and Thomas A.C. Reydon. The series is already very promising in publishing first-rate work. Unfortunately, though, these volumes suffer from Springer's high prices and the fact that they do not offer an option to purchase individual articles. Nonetheless, the series is a welcome contribution to scholarship related to the life sciences.

As with any edited collection, it is difficult to do justice to each part. Indeed, it would be ironic if a review of a book focused on issues of vitalism and related issues of holism and reductionism were to focus primarily on the parts.

In the introduction, the editors make clear that they do not intend a narrow look at what has traditionally been called "vitalism." They point to existing work for a sense of what that means and in particular to discussions that contrast vitalism and mechanism. Normandin and Wolfe want to pull together different ways of looking at a world that is not simply experiential. They are looking for what others have usually missed:

a key role vitalism has always played in scientific imagining -- between the spiritual and the material, the digital and the analog, reductionism and holism, order and chaos, the inert and the animated, the constraining and the liberating, the dead and the living, the closed and the open, the rigid and the dynamic, the structured and the spontaneous, and even, at points, as in the case of our rich collection, the old and the new. (pp. 11-12)

While I am not really sure that I fully grasp what they intend by invoking the "scientific image," nor how that connects with "scientific imagining," what is clear is that the book is an eclectic and provocative collection offering diverse ways of looking at efforts to understand life.

Life sciences form the central unifying theme, with various ways of getting at what life means or how to carry out a science of life. The papers fall into three sections grouped historically and with different emphases. The first section includes four cases from the nineteenth century. In "Jean-Baptiste Lamarck and the Place of Irritability in Life and Death", Guido Giglioni presents Lamarck as assuming that death is the natural condition and contrasting life and death with life as a "temporary and imponderable irritation" (p. 44) that "represented the complex of functions that resist death." (p. 43) Here vitalism focuses on what distinguishes life. Joan Steigerwald introduces organic vitality in Germany in the context of philosophical discussions of the "principle of life" and practical discussions of what a science of life should look like. Juan Rigoli discusses the move beyond what he calls "the novel of medicine" to seek what mid-century researchers thought of as a "science of ourselves." And Sean Dyde shows that discussions of life and mind in nineteenth century Britain included a variety of different ideas of vitalism.

This initial set of essays does a nice job, in fact, of addressing the range of issues that have been hidden in the older traditional focus on vitalism as an opponent to mechanism. With so many different ways of trying to capture what is meant by the vitality of life, and so many different approaches to studying life, vitalism becomes both much richer and much messier than most histories have suggested. What this set of examples shows is that there is still much more to study to get a full sense of how nineteenth century thinkers understood living organisms and processes. Vitalism involved trying to get at what it meant to have life, but within the context of different ideas about what that meant and what the alternatives might be.

The second set of five papers moves to the twentieth century and becomes more philosophical in tone and focus. Brian Garrett looks at issues of vitalism in distinction to emergent materialism. He enticingly suggests that we have developed a collective amnesia about debates from the 1920s, with their several versions of vitalism. If we look at Hans Driesch, J. Arthur Thomson, Arthur Lovejoy, and Herbert Spencer Jennings, for example, we see that any return to a search for a non-reductionistic materialism is not likely to succeed. Similarly, Christophe Malaterre sees emphases on emergence shifting from seeking alternatives to vitalism and moving toward seeking alternatives to reductionism. Emergence is popular again, but for different reasons than before.

Sebastian Normandin shows ways that the idiosyncratic psychiatrist Wilhelm Reich's ideas of "orgone biophysics" bring together sexuality, spirituality, society, politics, and the study of life in ways that challenge traditional comfortable ideas of vitality. Chiara E. Ferrario and Luigi Corsi discuss how neurologist and physician Kurt Goldstein puzzled about how to understand teleology in the context of a non-reductionistic materialism. They argue that Goldstein developed an "'epistemologically-minded' theory of biology" in his search for a "philosophy of existence" (p. 206). Giuseppe Bianco explores Georges Canguilhem's shift from anti-vitalism to a kind of vitalism, including what he calls "normative vitalism." This set of twentieth century cases shows a diversity of ways philosophers have interpreted the scientist's efforts to understand life. The editors urge us to take these versions of vitalism seriously by tying them to Sellars' scientific realism encapsulated in this phrase "the scientific image."

The third part has four papers, each of which looks at important biological issues in very different ways. Together, they make clear just how central the discussions of the phenomena and interpretations of life that led to vitalism were, even in the cases that are not explicitly about "vitalism". Although the papers largely do not directly employ the term, they get at central questions about how to understand life.

J. Scott Turner explores homeostasis as an essential feature of living organisms. Claude Bernard showed how important it was to recognize the internal environmental balance, and Turner connects that idea to understanding fitness and adaptation. Perhaps, he suggests provocatively, we can reach a new resolution of mechanism and vitalism disputes through a new metaphysics for biology. Though not entirely persuasive, especially in his suggestion that we must incorporate "long-shunned 'vitalist' concepts such as intentionality, design, cognition and intelligence as universal properties of life" (p. 287), Turner's essay requires us to think in different ways about adaptation.

Looking at the history of cell culture, Carlos Sonnenschein, David Lee, Jonathan Nguyen, and Ana Soto argue for rethinking what they see as the dominant assumption that cells are normally in a state of dividing rather than quiescence. Again, vitalism does not play a direct role here, but questions about what is normal in defining life and whether cell division is necessary or unusual raises questions about the vital phenomena under consideration.

John Dupré and Maureen A. O'Malley offer an elegant paper that explicitly does not talk about vitalism. In fact, they add a short preface to explain why they do not, as well as why they feel their discussion is important for any discussion of vitalism. Instead they ask what it means to be living, the role of intra-organism collaboration for evolution, and what counts as a biological individual. They appeal to current biological knowledge, which has definitively shown that most organisms, especially humans, are in reality complex adaptive communities. Collaboration is key for life in ways that they explain very effectively, arguing that metabolism is the means for survival and therefore basic for being alive.

William Bechtel wraps up the volume with an excellent argument that we should move beyond the old, tired basic of linear sequential steps. Instead, since life is complex and non-linear, we need a new conception of mechanism, based on systems biology, that is dynamic and yields new kinds of explanations. This approach requires computational modeling and, unlike traditional mechanism, can meet the challenges of vitalism.

What this last set of papers does is to take seriously the kinds of goals of vitalism, namely the uncomfortable convictions that life is complex, not reductionistic in any simple way, that systems are more than sums of parts, that something like organic metabolism is essential, and that there is more to the story than turning cell division off or on. In the context of the first two sets of examples, we get a very rich sense of what quite a range of different thinkers of the past and present have meant by invoking "vitalism." Then these authors offer very enticing ways to think about the same phenomena, developing different approaches to understanding life in ways that are not vitalistic but that do not ignore the important features that make life. It is this combination of perspectives, taken together, that accomplishes what the editors wanted. Together, they add to our understanding of history, philosophy and theory in the life sciences, while enriching our understanding of vitalism.