Voicing Dissent: The Ethics and Epistemology of Making Disagreement Public

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Casey Rebecca Johnson (ed.), Voicing Dissent: The Ethics and Epistemology of Making Disagreement Public, Routledge, 2018, 199 pp., $140.00, ISBN 9781138744288.

Reviewed by Scott Aikin, Vanderbilt University


This is a well-considered and lively collection of essays on the norms bearing on public disagreement. After the fall of 2016, with Brexit having passed in England and Donald Trump elected President of the United States, the question of what role protest and dissent plays in properly run public discourse became a pressing question for many academics. This book, then, is particularly timely.

The philosophically significant questions orienting the collection, reviewed in Johnson's very helpful introduction, are: what counts as a disagreement, and what norms bear on us when we discover that we disagree? Are we obligated to be publically on-record about not accepting some claim or decision when we disagree? What sense of 'public' is the relevant sense for dissent to be public objection? Are there alternatives to direct acts of objection for one to change the dialectical score on an issue? In all, Johnson's volume has eleven essays addressing this range of issues. My plan for this review is to focus on one debate that ties four of the authors in the volume into dialogue, and then to turn to remark on a few insights founds in some other articles.

One significant topic of focus is how to interpret silence in areas of political controversy. Sanford Goldberg argues that there are practical reasons why one should voice dissent, and so one's silence on an issue can be interpreted as one not having doubts about voiced opinions and even agreeing with them. To show this, Goldberg constructs a community, Knowville, wherein the following regularity obtains:

Disposition to Dissent: When anyone harbors doubts regarding an assertion made in one's presence, one speaks out publicly to indicate those doubts. (54)

Given this disposition's being exceptionless among the Knowvillians, Goldberg holds that there is normative pressure on audiences to speak out when they disagree, since it is hard to see how their not signaling disagreement is not also a signal of their acceptance or at least not having doubts. Further, assuming that members of Knowville are knowledgeable about the things they discuss, their finding things acceptable is evidence that the assertions in their presence are acceptable. So those who do not dissent when things they find doubtful are asserted not only suppress evidence that would undercut the claim, but they give some evidence that there isn't such undercutting evidence. Admittedly, Goldberg concedes, the Disposition to Dissent, though exceptionless in Knowville, is not exceptionless in our "ordinary community," but something weaker obtains:

Disposition to Dissent (Familiar): It is a familiar (though far from inevitable!) behavioral regularity that when one harbors doubts regarding an assertion made in one's presence, one speaks out publicly to indicate those doubts (57)

Goldberg holds that a reduced normative pressure will follow for members of this more familiar community, since audience silence will still signal acceptance or no doubts.

Jennifer Lackey's essay, "Silence and Objecting," responds to Goldberg's line of argument along two lines. The first is a methodological observation about inferences from idealized communities, like Knowville, to actual communities, like those in which we currently live. She terms the assumption behind the analogy the 'cooperative conversation view,' one where all participants in the dialogue are fully cooperative and of equal standing to contribute. An objection (or acceptance, for that matter) having traction in the form of uptake or change of record depends on the contributors having the requisite standing to do so. In cases where people have no recognized standing, where their voices are not heard, or when their contributions could put them in danger, the assumed regularity of the familiar form of the disposition to dissent disappears. In light of this non-ideal perspective, Lackey holds that "objecting is often a luxury, one that not everyone can afford" (91). The second stage of Lackey's reply is that, in light of the link between silence and social disadvantage, the normative pressure of the obligation to object is actually increased for those with social privilege.

Alessandra Tanesini's "Eloquent Silences: Silence and Dissent" complicates the notion that silence is a form of signaling acceptance. Instead, Tanesini holds that "silence can be an illocution which is used to communicate  . . . and silence, when eloquent, is not usually expressive of acceptance" (110). Illocutionary silences, on Tanesini's reading, are those wherein speaker meaning is communicated in "resisting elicitation" (116). For example, there are "non-submissive subordinate sulks," wherein students, for example, can challenge a teacher's authority with unresponsiveness. Or there may be long periods wherein one communicates that one no longer wishes to be part of a discussion, such as one's silence when asked "Are you angry at me?" Silence, can, then, be used to communicate censure and disdain. The consequence, as Tanesini holds, is that "even if we grant that audiences have a defeasible obligation to make manifest their dissent with speakers, it does not follow that such disagreements must be verbally communicated" (122).

The result of this fecund exchange is that it seems that one can concede that there are obligations to dissent, but these obligations can be overridden by or intensified by other factors, such as to what degree one's contributions will have uptake or will have positive or negative consequences. Moreover, it seems that even silence, when properly framed, can function as a form of dissent.

A final consideration of this constellation of issues involving disagreement, objection, and silence, is Mary Kate McGowan's model for having on-record counter-proposals, even for those who are not socially well-placed. In "Responding to Harmful Speech," McGowan argues not only that the 'more speech' response to harmful speech fails to undo the fact that the harmful speech nevertheless happened, but also that responding to such speech can be risky for the speakers who object. But silence, too often, can be harmful, because it "can be causally responsible for problematic content being added to the common ground." McGowan terms the conflict between speech and silence the "double bind" in that counter-speech "can backfire and be harmful but failing to speak can be harmful" (191). An alternative McGowan proposes is one that takes advantage of the fact that some speech cannot be undone. McGowan highlights the fact that one's proposals change the dialectical score, and having views and statements on-record early in a conversation is useful. McGowan's example is that of a junior member of an academic department proceeding with discussions about institutional roles for members of the department in an explicitly egalitarian fashion. Instead of overtly criticizing the hierarchy of the department, this department member proposes significant roles in departmental administration for non-tenure-track faculty for whom the jobs would be appropriate and salutary. McGowan holds that these kinds of contributions can have a kind of looping effect, in that "acting as if the department is egalitarian can come to make it so" (193). For sure, this kind of contribution is still risky in all the ways counter-speech can be in the double-bind, but it does not directly challenge the hierarchical views of some others, and it makes all mutually aware of the alternatives to the hierarchy. This McGowan holds is "the right kind of 'more speech'" (194).

I have here focused on only one of many lines of critical dialogue in Johnson's collection, and I believe its richness and insight is exemplary. In addition to this discussion of obligations and norms governing silence and speech in dissent, there are discussions of whether disagreement should really be epistemically troubling (by Catherine Elgin), whether useful dissent requires sincere disagreement (by Duncan Pritchard and by Casey Johnson), and whether there are political conditions that must obtain for disagreement to have proper uptake (by Klemens Kappel, by Michael Patrick Lynch, by Rachael Ann McKinney, and by Matthew Chrisman and Graham Hubbs). Social epistemologists, argumentation theorists, and political philosophers interested in deliberative democracy will find a great deal to appreciate in this volume.