Volition, Rhetoric, and Emotion in the Work of Pascal

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Thomas Parker, Volition, Rhetoric, and Emotion in the Work of Pascal, Routledge, 2008, 230pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415955508.

Reviewed by Michael Moriarty, Queen Mary, University of London


Thomas Parker rightly identifies the will as an absolutely central concept in the work of Pascal, and one deserving a specific study. Moreover, he seeks, very sensibly, to link Pascal's concept of the will with his strategy of persuasion. It is good to see a philosophical study of Pascal from the English-speaking world, in which his work, apart from the Wager, is often ignored by philosophers. Parker's work, moreover, draws on the best French-language scholarship on Pascal -- Philippe Sellier, Gérard Ferreyrolles, Jean Mesnard, Hélène Michon, Vincent Carraud are all cited -- as well as on English-language sources. It seeks to position Pascal's discourse of the will with respect to the seventeenth-century intellectual context and to investigate the relation between the will and knowledge, and between the will and eloquence. This is a promising basic framework.

The difficulty in producing a coherent philosophical discourse about Pascal as a philosopher is that he did not conform to the seventeenth-century paradigms of what a philosopher is or does. He did not operate within the framework of scholastic philosophy, with its careful arguments, objections, and distinctions, but nor did he copy such philosophical innovators as Descartes and Hobbes, who, in their radically different ways, sought to convince their readers by methodically constructing an argument on some reliable foundation. As a result, commentators are left to grapple with such ambiguous terms as cœur and sentiment, with their mixture of cognitive and appetitive elements, wondering whether Pascal uses them with different meanings in different contexts or whether there is a single concept integrating both aspects. Volonté, as Parker points out, is likewise ambiguous, though in a different way, since it can denote both the 'will' considered as a faculty and the acts of the will, or volitions.

As is commonly acknowledged, Pascal's concept of the will is largely derived from St Augustine, and perhaps it would have helped Parker's analysis had he expounded Augustine's conception at more leisure. Augustine thinks of the will, on the analogy with a physical body, as possessing an inner inclination towards its natural resting-place: just as fire, by an inner inclination, tends upwards, to the upper regions where it belongs, and a stone downwards, towards its natural resting-place in the centre of the earth, so the will has an inner tendency towards its resting-place, God: 'Thou hast made us for thyself,' he famously wrote in the Confessions, 'and our heart is restless till it find rest in thee.' This inner tendency he calls a pondus, a gravitational urge, and it is synonymous with love: 'pondus meum amor meus.' However, this upward inclination is countered by a downward inclination, a rival pondus, away from God and towards created things. Prior to any rational decision to make use of them for a particular purpose, created things have an automatic attraction for us, or we have one toward them, an attraction, or love, Augustine calls concupiscence, which stifles our attraction towards God, the supreme good, which attraction, or love, he calls charity. The human will is essentially a capacity for love, and what defines a particular will is the object of its love, ultimately God or some illusory and inadequate substitute for him. A good will, directed towards God, is a good love (charity); a bad will, directed towards creatures, a bad love (concupiscence). As appears from the above, however, the human will is fundamentally divided, and it is this division, discernible also in Pascal's account of the will, that is perhaps the key element in Parker's analysis. As Pascal explains, the will before the Fall was 'flexible': it was particularly attracted neither to good nor to evil. Adam and Eve could act in whatever way they thought most conducive to their happiness. The Fall extinguished this flexibility. It left human beings incapable of loving God above all things, and other things only for his sake. They are now, pretty nearly, the slaves of their own appetites, or, in other words, of concupiscence. This situation can only be remedied by the grace made available by the sacrifice of Christ, a grace that for Augustine and Pascal takes the form of a delight (delectation) in obedience to God more powerful than the delectation (concupiscence) that we experience in created things. In other words, grace, although it illuminates the intellect, is characterized above all by its impact on the will.

The problems for the early modern Roman Catholic theologian of an Augustinian persuasion was to explain how the impact of grace on the will does not suppress human freedom, without appearing to subordinate grace to the human will, as other Roman Catholic theologians (the so-called Molinists) were, fairly or unfairly, accused of doing. Pascal gave a remarkably succinct and powerful (albeit unfinished and fragmentary) exposition of the Augustinian approach in the Ecrits sur la grâce, and though these are mentioned here on occasion the book would have been stronger if they had been discussed more systematically. Nor is mention made of the remarkable passage on grace and the will in the eighteenth of the Provincial Letters:

God changes the heart of man by a celestial sweetness he infuses within it, which overcomes the delectation of the flesh, and brings it about that man, feeling on the one hand his mortality and nothingness and on the other discovering the greatness and eternity of God, comes to feel disgust at the sinful delights that separate him from the incorruptible good, and hence, finding his greatest joy in the God that so delights him, moves towards him without fail of his own accord, by an impulse that is wholly free, wholly voluntary, wholly born of love (tout amoureux).

Those who receive this grace could turn away from God, if they wished, but they would never want to, since, Pascal (quoting St Augustine) explains that the will embraces only what pleases it most since we cannot act but in keeping with what delights us most, and the delights of grace are stronger than those of concupiscence. The hedonism of this conception might have been analyzed further in Parker's book, and indeed, although not unmentioned, the concept of delectation does not receive the attention it requires. All of this might be thought irrelevant by a reader uninterested in theology as such, but the fact is that the key debates on the will in the early modern period are hard to extricate from their theological context (even Hobbes accused Descartes of failing to take account of the Calvinist denial of free will).

Parker by no means ignores the theological context and content of Pascal's thought, but he is interested in situating it within early modern philosophical debates. This, further, assists his design of analyzing Pascal's rhetorical strategy, because he can then attempt to show how Pascal engages with different categories of reader, categorized by their philosophical allegiances. What he wants most of all to emphasize is the Pascalian conception of the will as divided, in such a way that it is not wholly accessible to the agent, who is driven by what might be called unconscious motivations, if we were not worried by terminological anachronism (to my mind, Parker uses the word 'unconscious' excessively, which is not to say that seventeenth-century writers were unaware of the obscurities of motivation). For instance, we cannot endure inactivity, which confronts us with the unbearable fact of our own mortality and futility; we therefore escape into what Pascal calls divertissement (diversion), activities, such as dancing, hunting, or playing cards, which, we persuade ourselves, we really care about for their own sake, when in fact they offer no benefit but that of distracting us from the horrible reality of the human condition. Or again, our self-love, realizing and hating our intrinsic imperfection, prompts us to disguise our real nature from other people and from ourselves, condemning life to the status of a perpetual theatre of illusion. If, however, one is attempting to elucidate Pascal's concept of the will, it seems strange to decide that when he calls this a 'voluntary illusion' he really meant an 'involuntary illusion' (p. 34): in general one might have reservations about the extent to which Parker's analysis turns the will into an independent agency controlling human beings.

None the less, his emphasis on this divided nature of the will is very fruitful. So is his emphasis on the link between the will and persuasion, although here it might be thought that he might have said more about Pascal's strategy of 'making religion lovable', since this clearly appeals to the will. In short he has identified an important theme, and suggested lines along which it might be profitably investigated. The book also shows a close engagement with the text of the Pensées, and the capacity to develop a sustained argument.

But it does not quite fulfill its promise. Perhaps its main shortcoming is what, in principle, should be its strength: the attempt to position Pascal within philosophical debates of the time. This leads to an excessive stress on the singularity of his position, resulting in what come across as strained or insufficiently grounded interpretations. The argument for the view that Pascal thinks individuals can be mistaken about the emotions they are feeling (p. 78) is based on a dubious reading of fragment S243. To say that 'the will is also synonymous with our passions' (p. 81) is to make a very bold assertion, again without adequate textual support in S176. (The will, for St Thomas, is the intellectual appetite; the passions movements of the sensitive appetite. If Pascal rejects this distinction, we are not shown clearly why.) At times, one's misgiving is not that Pascal's position is being incorrectly described, but that the evidence adduced for the author's account of that position is defective. Sometimes, though, one feels the account is simply wrong, as in the analysis of S458 (p. 115): it is not at all clear that this stress on the will's power to focus on different aspects of things is thought by Pascal to make sense-perception unreliable, and the passage from De l'art de persuader which seems to be adduced to reinforce the point is saying that our behavior, instead of being motivated by reason, is motivated by opinions dictated by our pleasures. On a conceptual level, the argument seems to equate the free and the voluntary (pp. 30-36): but early modern writers of many different schools made a distinction between these. Jansenius, for instance, says that fallen human beings are necessitated to sin, but yet morally responsible because, when they sin, they are doing what they want.

There are other misapprehensions that might strike some readers as less important because they are not philosophical. But they do indicate an imperfect grasp of the historical and cultural context. For instance, repeated references to casuists (pp. 83, 120,129, 137) make it clear that the author conceives these as individuals who act cynically, who want, for instance, to fight a duel, clearly forbidden by Christian morality, and persuade themselves it can be made morally legitimate. But the casuist is the moral theologian whose teaching (according to Pascal's hostile representation) is seized on by the hypocrite to justify his ends.

However, even if Parker's analyses are not always convincing, his focus on the concept of the will has allowed him to produce a wide-ranging study that should prompt further investigation of this important aspect of Pascal's thought.