Vulnerability: New Essays in Ethics and Feminist Philosophy

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Catriona Mackenzie, Wendy Rogers, and Susan Dodds (eds.), Vulnerability: New Essays in Ethics and Feminist Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2014, 318pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199316656.

Reviewed by Joan C. Tronto, University of Minnesota


With Natalie Stoljar, Catriona Mackenzie edited one of the most influential collections of essays in feminist theory in the past two decades. In this collection, Mackenzie and her co-editors, Wendy Rogers and Susan Dodds, have produced another volume that will be important for decades to come. It explores many dimensions of the concept of vulnerability and argues for its centrality as a concept in ethics. Within Anglo-American philosophy, given the centrality of such concepts as autonomy and agency, vulnerability has not been given much attention. Around 30 years ago, Robert Goodin wrote a justification for social welfare spending that extended to liberal political theory a consequentialist argument for "protecting the vulnerable." Goodin's idea proved widely influential, providing a basic justification whose title made it almost intuitively clear. Susan Okin, in Justice, Gender and the Family, was among the liberal theorists of justice who took the idea to be entirely persuasive. While many have since provided critiques of Goodin, the idea of "the vulnerable" went long unexplored in Anglo-American ethics.

The introductory essay makes many significant contributions. "What is Vulnerability and Why Does It Matter for Moral Theory?" provides an account of why the co-editors are arguing for the centrality of this concept, but also why we now need a set of guideposts to help understand the concept. Vulnerability, they observe, has both universal and specific sets of meanings. "An important motivation of theorists who highlight the universality of inherent ontological vulnerability," they write, referring to such thinkers as Judith Butler, "is to focus attention on the need to reframe some of the founding assumptions of contemporary moral and political theory" (4). Yet another use of the term, such as Goodin's, "focuses on the contingent susceptibility of particular persons or groups to specific kinds of harm or threat by others" (6). How can one term do all of this work?

The editors propose that both of these ways of thinking about vulnerability are useful, and therefore we need a taxonomy to distinguish "distinct but overlapping kinds of vulnerability" (7). The taxonomy they offer is somewhat complex: it consists of three different sources of vulnerability and two states of vulnerability. The three sources include inherent vulnerability (those universal vulnerabilities intrinsic to the human condition), situational vulnerability (those that arise from context), and pathogenic vulnerability (situational vulnerabilities that arise from significant oppression or injustice, or "when a response intended to ameliorate vulnerability has the paradoxical effect of exacerbating existing vulnerabilities or generating new ones" (9)). Dispositional vulnerability represents a possible vulnerability (e.g., all women of child-bearing age might become pregnant) while occurrent vulnerability has actually happened (8-9).

From this complex taxonomy, the editors ask whether vulnerability by itself produces obligations, or whether vulnerability serves "as a signal that alerts us to obligations arising from other moral claims, such as those of harm or need" (10). They suggest that using vulnerability as a grounding for obligation allows us to critique contractarian notions of liberal theory, but is open to lines of criticism that are less severe when obligations are based, instead, on a notion such as need. They then observe that theories of justice need to answer such questions as who is responsible for dealing with vulnerability and how to address the problem that dealing with vulnerability often may produce further victimhood. Many of these questions have been addressed by theorists of care, but the advantage of starting from vulnerability is to place them into another and perhaps more familiar ethical framework.

In a second essay, Mackenzie addresses "The Importance of Relational Autonomy and Capabilities for an Ethics of Vulnerability." This important essay offers a powerful critique of another protagonist of universal vulnerability, Martha Fineman. Fineman's work has emphasized vulnerability as an alternative to the overly self-reliant autonomous individual, for example, in The Autonomy Myth. Mackenzie suggests that with a more refined account of relational autonomy, vulnerability and autonomy are not opposites but mutually important elements of a fully human life. She 'distinguishes, though, between the libertarian accounts of autonomy that are Fineman's real target and a fuller account of autonomy "understood as both the capacity to lead a self-determining life and the status of being recognized as an autonomous agent by others" as "crucial for a flourishing life in contemporary liberal democratic societies" (41). Invoking the notion of capabilities also helps to fill in how the capabilities approach fits within this liberal democratic framework.

Not all people are autonomous throughout their lives, though; some people are dependent. Susan Dodds' excellent "Dependence, Care and Vulnerability" helps to address the question of who are dependent and how they fit into a framework of vulnerability and autonomy. Drawing on the work of Margaret Urban Walker and Eva Kittay, Dodds argues that dependency occurs when care is necessary to solve problems of vulnerability. She agrees with Walker that assigning responsibilities for such care is a complex process, but she disagrees with Kittay that caregivers are inevitably placed in a situation of dependency (though they are in other ways vulnerable). Dodds thus considers some clarifications about the nature of care and highlights the problem of pathogenic vulnerability if care workers abuse or do not respect their clients.

Another important essay that builds from the original tensions in the universal-particular taxonomy is Jackie Leach Scully's "Disability and Vulnerability: On Bodies, Dependence, and Power." Scully also highlights the differences between vulnerability understood as universal (or "global") and "contingent" vulnerabilities. She notes that for disabled people, accepting one or the other of these views creates a dilemma; they often find themselves in situations where they need to think about both kinds of vulnerability, not one or the other. One of the most interesting claims she makes, in the section that asks "Exactly What Are Disabled People Vulnerable To?", is what she calls Ascribed Global Vulnerabilities, i.e., "the tendency on the part of the nondisabled to extrapolate a genuine vulnerability in one area of a disabled person's life (e.g., physical weakness, economic precariousness) to a globally increased vulnerability stretching over the entirety of that person's life" (209). The concerns of disabled people present a concrete case about why these philosophical issues of defining vulnerability are so critical.

The rest of the essayists do not employ this taxonomy to address questions about vulnerability. Many of them deploy a conception of vulnerability to address other moral issues. For example, in "The Role of Vulnerability in Kantian Ethics," Paul Formosa shows that "there is no reason why vulnerability cannot play an important role in Kantian ethics" (95). Indeed, he goes further and notes that we are all susceptible in a broad sense of vulnerability "to being used as a mere means by others" (103). He also observes that Kantian ethics would ask us to be more attentive to those who are "narrowly" more vulnerable as well. Drawing on theories of recognition, Joel Anderson shows how exercising our autonomy requires recognition by others in order to make those exercises fully realized and that autonomy and vulnerability to others are "entwined." Wendy Rogers describes the place of the concept of vulnerability in contemporary bioethics. Margaret Urban Walker explains the difficulties of reparations as recreating a "moral vulnerability" among the victims. Marilyn Friedman uses the notion of vulnerability to make a case for the injustice of the ways in which women who are subject to domestic violence are often held responsible for failing to protect their children from their own abusers. Mianna Lotz notes the vulnerability of children to their parents' values. Amy Mullin considers the special needs of children for care, and the collection ends with an essay by Rosemarie Tong on the needs of aging people from the standpoint of vulnerability. Each of these essays does a fine job of illuminating the ways in which vulnerability helps us to understand morally difficult situations in a new light.

This collection illustrates the usefulness and diversity of the concept of vulnerability. The editors did not press upon the authors a single notion of vulnerability, and the volume is probably stronger for these divergent ways of thinking about vulnerability. Although the universal and particular forms of vulnerability play off against one another throughout the volume, there is no message, save the importance of this idea, that links the volume together.

In their introduction, Mackenzie, Rogers, and Dodds note that "A notable feature of the philosophical literature on vulnerability . . . is the diversity of background moral theories within which the concept has been analyzed" (17). While this is true, and while the essays represent various strands of feminist, Kantian, and relational moral theory, some elements of the diversity of these originary moral theories are not fully represented. Many continental writers on vulnerability emphasize other aspects of universal vulnerability, the fragility of life, for example, which lead them in different directions. The emphasis on liberal democratic moral and political theories may have flattened a question about whether vulnerability is best described as leading to obligations. Some feminist scholars who have emphasized human vulnerability, for example, might suggest that vulnerability leads directly to concerns about responsibility, rather than having to go through a two-step process in which obligations are acknowledged and then responsibility is assigned. The "protection" that vulnerability seems to call forth may require further analysis as well. As Sara Ruddick long ago noted, sometimes the response to vulnerability is care, sometimes the response to vulnerability is aggression. Thinking through issues of autonomy, vulnerability and violence remain part of the future agenda raised by this volume.

In all, though, this is a remarkably rich and important collection that will soon become essential reading in contemporary feminist and moral philosophy.