Physicalism Deconstructed: Levels of Reality and the Mind–Body Problem

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Kevin Morris, Physicalism Deconstructed: Levels of Reality and the Mind–Body Problem, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 265pp., $84.00, ISBN 9781108472166.

Reviewed by Jessica M. Wilson, University of Toronto


Physicalism, generally characterized, is the view that physical goings-on, typically in massively complex combination, constitute a complete metaphysical basis for all the world’s goings-on. This characterization takes many specific forms. Popular of late is non-reductive physicalism (NRP), according to which some ‘higher-level’ ordinary or special scientific goings-on exist and are irreducible to—i.e., are not identical to—any lower-level physical goings-on; different versions of NRP offer different accounts of the cotemporal dependence relation(s) holding between higher-level and physical goings-on, as involving supervenience, functional or powers-based realization, primitive ‘Grounding’, and so on. In his book, Kevin Morris presents an extended argument by cases against the viability of NRP and its associated ‘leveled’ conception of reality. Existing versions of NRP face a dilemma, he argues: each either conforms to physicalism, but collapses into a ‘one-level’ view, or supports multiple levels, but in a way incompatible with physicalism. Morris concludes that the only viable versions of physicalism are ‘one-level’ views. Here too there are options, including reductive physicalism (RP), on which seemingly higher-level goings-on exist but are identical to some or other (again, typically massively complex) physical goings-on, and eliminativist physicalism (EP), which eschews higher-level goings-on entirely. Morris’s preference is for a version of EP which is ‘non-skeptical’ in making room for the truth of ordinary and special scientific claims, and the constructive part of his project is to develop and defend this view.

The book’s structure reflects Morris’s aims and dialectical strategy, though in somewhat scattered fashion. Chapters 1, 3, 4, and 5 critically assess whether supervenience, functional realization, subset realization, or primitive Grounding, respectively, support NRP; chapter 2 presents the exclusion problem and what Morris takes to be its anti-NRP, pro-one-level import; chapter 6 offers an historical and sociological explanation for NRP’s rise to prominence; chapter 7 diagnoses NRP’s failures, then develops and defends Morris’s version of EP.

Morris’s book is a valuable contribution. For the reasons below, I don’t think his case against NRP succeeds, and his version of EP faces a serious difficulty. Even so, this is an admirably clear, subtle, and well-informed brief, and philosophers interested in the structure of natural reality have much to gain from Morris’s insightful discussion and argumentation.

If I have a complaint beyond the specific objections that are par for the philosophical course, it is that Morris’s discussion sometimes lingers on side issues and gives short shrift to more central ones. Sometimes this doesn’t matter for Morris’s discussion, as in the unnecessarily extensive treatment of whether the possibility that supervenience might be ‘brute’ and unexplainable poses a problem for supervenience-based approaches to NRP (it doesn’t).[1] But other dialectical imbalances do matter, as I’ll discuss down the line.

The Exclusion Argument

A challenge to NRP and the leveled conception lies in the exclusion argument, pressed by Kim (1989, 1998, and elsewhere). Focusing on mental properties, the concern is that there is no way to reconcile the NRPist’s assumptions that (i) mental properties exist, (ii) mental properties are efficacious, (iii) mental properties are distinct from yet completely metaphysically dependent on physical properties, and (iv) the physical is causally closed (every physical effect has a purely physical cause), with the assumption that (v) effects are not systematically causally overdetermined (a.k.a. ‘the exclusion principle’). When the effect at issue is physical, the NRPist’s assumptions (i)–(iv) seem to support cases having the following structure:

Figure 2





Figure 2.1  The causal exclusion problem.

Such a case apparently conflicts with assumption (v), and therein lies the rub.

Morris takes the exclusion argument to lend prima facie support to one-level over leveled versions of physicalism, given that the latter must countenance ‘dependent overdetermination’ as per Figure 2.1; for such overdetermination is, first, unparsimonious, and second, counterintuitive, as evidenced by his students’ responses to Kim’s argument.

These considerations play an important role in Morris’s discussion. A common refrain is that the NRPist’s higher-level causes are problematic on these grounds, such that if one can avoid positing such causes, one should do so. And that dependent overdetermination is counterintuitive is key to Morris’s response to NRPists who resist the exclusion argument by flagging accounts of causation compatible with rejecting (v). Morris concedes that pretty much every live account of causation is so compatible, but since dependent overdetermination is ‘counterintuitive’, the lesson he draws is not that the exclusion principle is false, but rather that those concerned with the exclusion problem and those offering accounts of causation are engaged in “different intellectual projects” (88), with the former targeting the metaphysics of natural reality and the latter targeting ‘causal thinking’ in the diverse sciences.

Given their importance, it’s worth noting that these motivations for a one-level view aren’t compelling. Parsimony considerations apply only ceteris paribus, but it’s unclear that other things would be equal if there was no dependent overdetermination, since it would then be unclear how to make sense of all the ordinary and special scientific claims naturally interpreted as taking real higher-level causation for granted. On Morris’s EP such claims come out true, but the associated semantics (if there is one---a point to which I will return) will introduce ideological costs if an attempt is made to provide informative non-standard truth conditions for the claims, and ontological and/or methodological costs if higher-level truth is simply primitive. Nor does the claim that dependent overdetermination is counterintuitive carry much weight, not just because student opinion is variable, but because it would be surprising if what is commonly presupposed in ordinary and scientific contexts (not to mention accounts of causation, which take intuitions into account) was really all that counterintuitive. Relatedly, it is implausible to recast the metaphysical accounts of causation on offer as irrelevant to assessing the exclusion principle, since engaged in epistemological “intellectual projects”.

A more accurate initial take on the exclusion problem is simply as challenging those maintaining that seeming common commitment to dependent overdetermination can be taken at face value to spell out exactly how dependent overdetermination works, given that it can’t be understood along ‘firing squad’ lines. NRPists have taken up the challenge, and there are now many accounts on offer. If none withstands scrutiny, then those inclined towards physicalism might be forced towards a one-level view; but that’s a potential upshot as opposed to a take-home message of the problem.


Chapters 2 and 3 treat functional and ‘subset’ realization, respectively. On accounts of functional realization, higher-level features are associated with causal or functional roles played (at least in worlds like ours) by physical features. On accounts of subset realization, higher-level features are associated with distinctive sets of powers (‘power profiles’), and each token power of a higher-level feature on a given occasion is identical to a token power of its physical base feature on that occasion. These accounts of realization aim to model dependent overdetermination in a way compatible with physicalism, with the key idea being that higher-level causation does not involve any new or different powers. As Morris correctly describes the subset strategy as applied to the case above, “both M1 and P1 count as causes of P2, [but] P2 is not thereby caused twice, because the power that is manifested in bringing about P2 is among those powers shared by M1 and P1” (151). Representing powers by dots, a more accurate representation of the case on this view is then as follows: 

Fig 4Figure 4.2    The one causing picture of higher-level causation.

Morris argues that these realization relations face the aforementioned dilemma: if they are compatible with physicalism they are “best interpreted in one-level terms”, while if they successfully motivate higher-level reality they are “incapable of defining a physicalist metaphysic” (126). Focusing on the first horn, why think that physicalist appeals to realization fail to support higher levels? Morris allows that functional realization admits of non-reductive interpretation, whereby a functional predicate refers to a higher-level role property, but maintains that given the presumed problems with dependent overdetermination, one can and so should deny that functional predicates so refer, with attributions of such predicates rather registering inexact similarities between physical goings-on. In the case of subset realization, he rather suggests that the relation at issue does not admit of non-reductive interpretation: “if properties are the properties that they are in virtue of their powers, it is difficult to see why a property that has all and only . . . physical powers should not be regarded as . . . physical” (135).

Neither line of thought provides a quick route to one-level physicalism. As with parsimony considerations, the mere availability of a one-level interpretation of a realization relation doesn’t count for much. If dependent overdetermination had been established as problematic maybe that would tilt the scale, but as above the exclusion argument alone doesn’t do this, and more generally whether such overdetermination is problematic is what is at issue. Proponents of functional realization will thus maintain that the best (most straightforward, least revisionary) interpretation of true claims containing functional predicates is one on which the predicates pick out higher-level properties, which are not plausibly identified (as Morris acknowledges) with any realizer or (e.g., disjunction of) realizers. And proponents of subset realization will maintain that though every power of a subset-realized property is an (uncontroversially physical) power of its physical realizer on a given occasion, nonetheless the subset-realized property cannot be identified with its realizer (or any physical property), since the realized property has a power profile no physical property has, as is reflected in causal difference-making considerations (if my thirst had been differently realized, I would have still reached for the Fresca) and/or the comparatively abstract causal joints associated with special science laws.[2]

Unfortunately, Morris does not present or engage with these or other NRPist strategies for blocking one-level collapse in enough detail. In the case of subset realization the omission is especially glaring, and is associated with another dialectical imbalance. To wit: Morris spends six pages considering the prospects for a version of subset realization which would gain higher-level reality by taking higher-level features to have ‘non-physical powers’—a reading no proponent of subset realization advances, since key to the approach is the ensuring of physical acceptability of a realized feature by requiring its powers to each be identical to a physical power—while reserving treatment of the actual strategies advanced by subset theorists to a footnote:

Wilson (2011, forthcoming), for example, suggests that on the subset view, higher-level causes may be more “proportional” or “difference-making” with respect to the effects that they bring about than physical realizers, even though physical realizers are causally sufficient for any effect brought about by some subset-realized property; see also Shoemaker (2001, 2007). One question is whether this really comports with the subset idea at all—can the powers of a mental occurrence really be a subset of the powers of a physical occurrence, if the former is a difference-making cause of certain events while the latter is not? Even if an affirmative answer is possible, talk of mental and physical occurrences only involving a single “causing” becomes strained if mental causes are difference-making causes while physical causes are not—how could a mental occurrence’s bringing about some event involve the very same “causing” as some physical occurrence’s bringing about that event, if the one is more proportional or difference-making than the other with respect to that event? Or, if there is only one “causing,” how is this supposed to answer exclusionist concerns about an overabundance of causes? (154, note 32)

The answers to these questions, treated here as merely rhetorical, can be found in the works Morris cites. Yes, an appeal to difference-making considerations (not to be confused with a difference-making account of causation) comports with the subset strategy, as is illustrated in various case studies (involving, e.g., pecking pigeons, or reachings for water), since on this approach that a higher-level feature tracks certain difference-making considerations precisely reflects that the feature has fewer token powers than its realizer(s). And there is no conflict between supposing that a higher-level feature tracks difference-making considerations and supposing that anything said feature causes on a given occasion is also caused by its physical realizer, for there are two ways for a feature to be distinctively efficacious: first, by having a distinctive power;[3] second, by having a distinctive power profile. While a subset NRPist will deny that higher-level features are distinctively efficacious in the first sense, they can happily maintain that they are distinctively efficacious in the second. Relatedly, that there are two ways for a feature to be distinctively efficacious answers “the challenge for the “one causing” proposal . . . to make sense of the idea of distinct property instances without effectively depriving [them[4]] of causal significance” (152). It would have been good for Morris to more substantively engage with these strategies, since not doing so undercuts his conclusion that “it is difficult, and perhaps not possible, to work out the details so that the resulting outlook provides a satisfactory nonreductive physicalism or a compelling answer to the exclusion problem” (154).

That said, in Chapter 7, Morris offers a general ‘diagnosis’ of NRP’s difficulties, in which he suggests that in order to gain physical acceptability, the NRPist must appeal to some or other internal relation—but any goings-on internally related to physical goings-on are bound to themselves be physical (223). Granting the need for an internal relation, why accept the latter claim? The determinate-determinable relation is an internal relation, and some maintain that (as I have argued) determinables are irreducible to determinates (or disjunctions thereof), and more generally are irreducibly less than maximally specific. Now suppose, as some do, that the physical goings-on are maximally determinate. In that case, one couldn’t take determinables of physical determinates to be physical, on pain of contradiction. The case of physical determinates serves as a ‘proof of concept’ for how internal relations might span levels, but the moral generalizes; for the NRPist will typically think of different levels as comprised by goings-on sensitive to different levels of ontological and causal grain, as reflected in their distinctive power profiles and associated systems of laws.

So there is no quick route to one-level physicalism. To make progress beyond registering of intuitions (e.g., to the effect that one doesn’t see why a property realized by a physical property isn’t itself physical) requires specific attention to the criteria of individuation of physical goings-on, and of levels more generally, that are operative in (at least some) NRPist accounts.

Non-skeptical Eliminativism

Though NRP remains a live option, might EP, at least in its non-skeptical versions, also be a live option? Morris makes a good if incomplete case for a positive answer.

To start, as Morris emphasizes via some interesting historical discussion in Chapter 6, the failure of type-reductionist versions of physicalism has been too quickly taken to support NRP. Morris’s line is that the neglect of EP reflects a conflation which occurred when the failure of logical empiricists to reductively ‘unify’ the sciences along semantic or epistemic routes was, as he puts it, ‘metaphysicalized’ by Kim and Fodor in ways setting the stage for NRP to become the default position. Independent of this take on the rise of NRP, in any case Morris is right that EP deserves attention, as an alternative on which “the kind of broadly semantic and epistemic irreducibility often thought to refute reductive physicalism does not mandate levels-based metaphysics” (224), and where instead the idea is “to bypass higher-level entities in favor of a purely physical metaphysic that countenances the truth of ordinary and special science discourse” (225).

As Morris observes, there are different ways to fill in the core idea, including by appeal to truthmaking or Grounding:

On the truthmaking approach, the physical character of the world makes true all higher-level truths that have truthmakers, while on the Grounding account, all higher-level truths are Grounded in truths that describe how things are in Reality, which for the physicalist consists in how things are physically. (225)

Crucially, for the EPist, the non-existence of higher-level goings-on applies also to the truthmaking and Grounding relations at issue; these relations are “not metaphysically deep” (227), and more generally “these proposals do not involve different commitments about the content of reality”. Their role is simply to “help articulate” the contrast between EP and other conceptions of natural reality, given that the (one-level) metaphysics has already been settled. On such a lightweight approach no systematic account of the relations or of when and how they are operative is to be expected: “To demand rigorous, substantive accounts of truthmaking or Grounding in the present context is to misunderstand the import of these notions in one-level physicalism” (230). Nor is any systematic account of what goings-on count as truthmakers or Grounds for higher-level statements to be expected.

Morris addresses three concerns with EP so construed. The first is that even if no systematic account can be given of which truthmakers or Grounds are operative for which truths, in any case these must involve arrangements of physical goings-on, which in turn will reintroduce levels; Morris rightly dismisses this concern, on grounds that “any comprehensive one-level metaphysic should be granted at least some “modes of combination” (232). The second is that EP fails to treat higher-level entities with sufficient metaphysical seriousness; Morris rightly observes that this just amounts to charging him with his view. The third concern is that (as I have complained) EP is “seriously revisionary” with respect to ordinary and special scientific discourse; here he replies that while this might be true for skeptical EP, non-skeptical EP can render true higher-level claims, and even accommodate special-scientific talk of levels, so long as these are given a descriptive rather than metaphysical interpretation. But there is more to being non-revisionary than simply making the relevant claims true, somehow or other. To be non-revisionary, the truth of the claims must reflect the usual understanding of what the claims express, and the semantic means by which this understanding is encoded.

The latter issue raises what seems to me to be the most serious concern with non-skeptical EP—namely, that it is unclear what semantics might be associated with higher-level claims. Morris does not address this issue (another dialectical imbalance, perhaps), and given what he says about how no systematic account is to be expected of truthmaking, Grounding, or their application, he will presumably also say that no systematic semantics of higher-level claims is to be expected. Moreover, it is unclear how a systematic semantics might be given without inviting a reinterpretation of EP as a form of RP, on which higher-level expressions do refer—just not to higher-level goings-on. The lack, either in fact or in-principle, of a systematic semantics of ordinary and special scientific discourse is a very high price to pay, and given the presumed failings of RP, I, for one, am inclined to conclude that NRP is more attractive than ever. The debate continues, but advanced by Morris’s illuminating explorations.


Kim, Jaegwon. 1989. ‘The Myth of Nonreductive Materialism’. Proceedings and Addresses of the American Philosophical Association 63:31–47.

———. 1998. Mind in a Physical World. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Howell, Robert. 2009. ‘Emergentism and Supervenience Physicalism’. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 87: 83–98.

Morris, Kevin. 2014. ‘Supervenience Physicalism, Emergentism,

and the Polluted Supervenience Base’. Erkenntnis 79: 351–365.

Shoemaker, Sydney. 2001. ‘Realization and Mental Causation’. In Proceedings of the 20th World Congress in Philosophy, 23–33. Cambridge: Philosophy Documentation Center.

———. 2007. Physical Realization. Oxford University Press.

Wilson, Jessica M. 1999. ‘How Superduper does a Physicalist Supervenience Need to Be?. Philosophical Quarterly 49:33–52.

———. 2011. ‘Non-Reductive Realization and the Powers-Based Subset Strategy’. The Monist 94:121–154.

———. Forthcoming. Metaphysical Emergence. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

[1] Here the real action concerns whether supervening with metaphysical necessity suffices to ensure physical acceptability, and Morris’s compelling argument (based in his 2014 response to Howell 2009) that if NRPists are to accommodate physically acceptable higher-level goings-on while ruling out physically unacceptable higher-level goings-on, they must do so by means of a more substantive realization relation, rendering the appeal to supervenience otiose.

[2] Of course, all this requires having a handle on what individuates levels in general, and the physical level in particular. Here again, NRPists have their accounts.

[3] Whatever this comes to—perhaps the manifestation of a non-Humean disposition, perhaps the occurrence of a given Humean regularity, etc.

[4] As opposed to individual powers.