Wagering on an Ironic God: Pascal on Faith and Philosophy

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Thomas S. Hibbs, Wagering on an Ironic God: Pascal on Faith and Philosophy, Baylor University Press, 2017, 204pp., $44.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781481306386.

Reviewed by Graeme Hunter, University of Ottawa(Emeritus)/Dominican University College


This unusual book is not a typical monograph on Pascal. It is a collection of five related essays. The first, "Irony, Philosophy and the Christian Faith," sketches the argument the author intends to develop. The second and third, on Montaigne and Descartes respectively, provide sketches of the late Renaissance and early modern figures with whom Hibbs plans to compare and contrast Pascal. The fourth chapter, called "The Quest for Wisdom", develops Pascal's uniquely "ironic" approach to philosophical inquiry. The final chapter, from which the book derives its title, is a study of Pascal's famous "Wager Argument."

Hibbs takes for granted -- what no one contests -- that Pascal was deeply influenced by both Montaigne and Descartes and that they are often his interlocutors throughout the Pensées. In connection with these interlocutors Hibbs propounds several, perhaps not unprecedented, but still uncommon, theses. The first of these is that Montaigne, Descartes and Pascal were alike in emulating Socrates, and in making inquiry into the good life the center of their philosophy.

Secondly, Hibbs finds similarities in the ironic styles of Pascal and Montaigne. Both deploy techniques of paradox, concealment and indirection to make their reader acknowledge "the limitations of the human ability to understand." The pedagogical purpose behind this writerly strategy is to lead the reader to an "awareness of his own ignorance," a state which philosophers since Socrates have considered the precondition for understanding.

Then come the differences. According to Montaigne, the condition of perplexity at which inquiring minds inevitably arrive is never overcome. The most we can hope for is a Pyrrhonian peace of mind that will come when we acknowledge the impotence of reason. When we see that the questions reason raises are unanswerable, we may turn our minds to more achievable ends. "Ignorance and incuriosity," Montaigne says, "are too soft pillows for a well-made head." They are pillows on which Hibbs' Pascal, however, refuses to recline.

Hibbs' Descartes differs from Montaigne in two fundamental ways. First, his approach is direct rather than ironic. Secondly, his goal is to refute the scepticism induced by Montaigne's ironic pedagogy and then to show how mathematics and science can make us "masters and possessors of nature," and in that way satisfy in human and material terms the longings we once thought spiritual, other-worldly, and unachievable, at least in this life. The Cartesian mind stands in sharp contrast to the mind of Montaigne: it is clear; its science is useful; its future is secure.

The next thing is to connect the dots. Hibbs' Pascal, like Socrates and Montaigne, is ironical, and he agrees with them about the limits of the human mind. Pascal differs from Montaigne however, and agrees with Socrates and Descartes that our transcendent longings demand satisfaction. But Pascal heaps scorn on Descartes' idea that the gadgets of technology and the remedies of modern medicine will do the trick. For Pascal, as for his ancient mentor, Augustine, our minds were made by God and will only find rest in God. Scepticism may frustrate our attempts to understand, but it will never give us rest. "Reasons of the heart" will always make themselves heard above all the noise of sceptical argument.

Sixty-two pages of this short book (it has only 191 pages of text) are devoted to Montaigne and Pascal, and 37 go to the introductory chapter. That leaves Hibbs only 92 pages in which to defend his view of Pascal. While it is desirable to contextualize the figure you are writing about, it is very ambitious to try to set the record straight on three highly controversial figures with so few pages to go around. It is also not clear why Hibbs thought it desirable to divide his energies in that way.

The chapters on Montaigne and Descartes are controversial. If they are necessary to Hibbs' account of Pascal, then they may undermine it rather than support it. If, however, Hibbs would argue that these chapters are no more than context, and that his argument concerning Pascal is independent of them, the reader will wonder what they are doing here. Wouldn't we have been better off with brief glosses of Montaigne and Descartes and more material to buttress the account of Pascal?

Hibbs has many insights readers will value into all three of his protagonists. But scholars of the early modern period are going to have questions about his reconstruction of each figure. Here are some points I find questionable.

Hibbs repeatedly attributes to Descartes the view quoted above, that the new science will make us "masters and possessors of nature." The implication, I suppose, is that science will turn us into gods. But Descartes has been misquoted. He says that we will become "like masters and possessors of nature," which is to say that we will cooperate with God in the management of this world -- a doctrine as old and orthodox as it is uncontentious.

Hibbs calls Descartes a 'reformer' (p. 77), though in his Discourse on Method Descartes excoriated reformers, both religious and political, and said that he leaves both species of reform to those whom God has appointed by birth to rule, or by revelation to prophesy. Perhaps Hibbs thinks Descartes is only pretending when he says these things, but he owes the reader an explanation.

In another place we are told that, "for Descartes, pride is not, as it was for his Christian predecessors, a vice." Pride, for Descartes, Hibbs tells us, is "a kind of joy based on the love we have for ourselves and resulting from the belief or hope we have of being praised by certain other persons." The definiens Hibbs is quoting here is taken from §204 of The Passions of the Soul. The difficulty is that the passion Descartes is defining there is not orgueil (pride), but what he calls gloire, which we might think of as "taking pride" in something we have achieved. Of orgueil Descartes says in §157 of the same work that it is "always a great vice." He says the same thing in several other places and never says anything different.

One final example: Hibbs remarks on several occasions that Descartes has nothing to say about death, and twice he conjectures that Descartes must therefore agree with Montaigne that the only thing to do in the face of death is to change the subject. By Descartes' "silence" about death, however, Hibbs can mean only that the subject does not arise in his published writings. It is a prominent theme in his long correspondence with Princess Elizabeth of Bohemia and it also arises in correspondences with Mersenne, and Huygens. Writing to his friend, Pierre Chanut, Descartes offers a jocular account of why he has never published anything about death and related matters. I paraphrase:

My refutation of scepticism has led to my being thought a sceptic; my proofs of the existence of God persuaded some readers that I am an atheist. What would they make of me, then, if I were to write of what becomes of the soul after death, or explain how to love life fully and yet also leave it without fear?[1]

I do not mean to imply that Hibbs could find no answers to the questions I am raising. However, his leaving them unanswered supports my suggestion that it was rash to deal with three such controversial figures in so small a space. Many claims that require defence are left undefended.

The longer treatment given Pascal is correspondingly more convincing, though still not long or convincing enough. Hibbs' development of the role of Church and community in Pascal's thought, which comes in the last chapter of the book, is an important exception. It constitutes a significant addition to the literature on both the Wager in particular and Pascal's thought more generally. If only the whole book had been devoted to developing this idea! As things stand, the fourth chapter and the early parts of the fifth leading up to Hibbs' excellent conclusion raise troubling questions on nearly every page. I can only give a couple of examples.

Any scholar who has ever examined the Wager will know that it is a minefield. The manuscript on which it is based has been described by George Brunet as "a draft diabolically scribbled, barely legible in places, mangled, without order, heaped with erasures . . ." Out of the mess, however, generations of talented editors have managed to extract an established, if still imperfect, text. But those brave enough to write on the Wager must still climb over the limitless piles of contradictory secondary literature which lie like fortress walls, protecting the corrupt manuscript within.

Hibbs acknowledges none of these problems, though his artful dodging of the greater part of them must be admired. Still, there are several cruxes so central that they can't be avoided and in some of them, I think, his account falls seriously short. Here are a couple of examples:

The genius of the Wager, of course, lies in persuading reluctant believers to bet their lives on God and the Catholic Church. They ought to bet that way because the Catholic Church teaches that a little temporal felicity and an infinity of eternal beatitude attend those who do, while ennui and misery are the lot of those who don't. Pascal admits that we cannot know whether the teaching of the Church is right or wrong. A bet either way has equal likelihood of being true. But because a bet on the Church, if true, is infinitely more rewarding, the wise wagerer will wager on the Church.

Why should I bet at all, you might wonder. Because those who refuse to bet forfeit all the benefits of wagering on the Church just as surely as do those who wager against it.

The novelty and pizzazz of Pascal's argument from probability and self-interest made the Wager an instant hit and a great topic of discussion. One of the consistent objections to it, however, came to be known as the "many gods" objection. The wager argument takes for granted that there are only two options before us: we must either become Catholics or not. But other religions may propose other gods who promise great rewards, or other descriptions of the Catholic God. Where there are more than two options, the Wager argument loses its cogency.

This objection was proposed not long after the appearance of the Pensées and has proved to be a hardy perrennial ever since. Nevertheless, it is quite easy to refute.[2] Hibbs seems to think he has refuted it, but he hasn't.

One way to answer the objection is to pretend that Pascal was proposing a generic argument for belief in God rather than an apology for Catholicism. Then, since all religions propose the same bet, we are returned to the binary choice on which the Wager argument depends for its validity. But this solution is unavailable to Pascal, as Hibbs rightly points out. Pascal is constructing an apology for Roman Catholicism, not for religion as such.  Recognizing this point, however, does not count as a response to the objection. It supports the objection by eliminating one possible reply. Hibbs needs to say more.

Finally, Hibbs sometimes makes claims about Pascal's teaching for which he offers too little support. For example, after admitting that there are passages in which Pascal appears to be a "thoroughgoing voluntarist," and citing one of the Pensées that hints at voluntarism (p. 179), Hibbs denies that Pascal really is a voluntarist. Based on the one ambiguous passage Hibbs cites, he could be right. But he is not right. Pascal's Écrits sur la grâce (Writings on Grace) are the place to look for incontrovertible evidence of his voluntarism. Hibbs ought to have explained how the author of the following words could be excused from voluntarism:

There are three kinds of men: some never arrive at faith; others arrive at faith but do not persevere, dying in mortal sin; the last group arrive at faith and persevere in charity until their death. Jesus Christ did not wish the first group to receive any grace through his death, for they received none. He did wish to ransom the second group. He gave them the grace that would have conducted them to salvation, had they persevered. But he did not wish to give them the special grace of perseverance, without which no one ever perseveres. As to the last group, Jesus Christ desired their salvation absolutely and conducted them to it by means both certain and infallible.[3]

This book is packed with fine observations about Montaigne, Descartes and Pascal and there's an arresting account in the last chapter of the importance of the Church to the argument of the Wager. But the supporting arguments of the book's larger edifice are too few, I fear, and too thin to hold it all together. It would be good to see Hibbs address the critiques that are sure to come.

[1] Descartes, Oeuvres, AT 4, 536-7.

[2] See Graeme Hunter (2012, 2013), Pascal the Philosopher: An Introduction, University of Toronto Press, pp. 125-129; also "Not Many Gods: On a Famous Objection to Pascal," forthcoming in Science et Esprit.

[3] Louis Lafuma ed. (1963), Pascal: Oeuvres complètes, Seuil, p. 313, column A.