War and Individual Rights: The Foundations of Just War Theory

Placeholder book cover

Kai Draper, War and Individual Rights: The Foundations of Just War Theory, Oxford University Press, 2016, 254pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199388899.

Reviewed by Nick Fotion, Emory University


Kai Draper wants very much to present a new version of just war theory. Traditional theory has its virtues but "some of its basic principles are little more than vague aphorisms, and others are simply mistaken." (2) His theory, as his title makes clear, would feature the concept of (individual) rights. When it comes to discussing the ethics of war, he believes that that concept has been much neglected. He wants to undo this neglect mainly because rights-talk is less vague and so has a tendency to give us all more precise and demanding guidance as to what we should and should not do when it comes to war.

But Draper has a problem. Rights-talk is more complicated than, for example, utility-talk. So he feels compelled to develop the foundations for such talk. Indeed, the foundations he cites are so extensive that they take up more than half of his book. Thankfully, however, Draper has a highly stylized way of building foundations so it is relatively easy to tell what he is up to.

His way begins by telling scores of trolley-like stories. One of the stories he tells is a version of one that Judith Jarvis Thomson gave us long ago.

Push. This is the case in which five lives are threatened by a runaway trolley and the only way someone (call her "Rescuer") can save those lives is to push a very large man ("Victim") off a bridge and onto the tracks below so that the trolley will strike him and, as a consequence of the drag created by the enormous bulk of his body, come to a stop before it reaches the five. Rescuer chooses to save the five lives, and so Victim dies as a foreseen consequence of being struck by the trolley. (126)

Telling stories is the first part of his foundations enterprise. To give one a sense of how varied these stories are, here is a second example.

Mistake II. On a dare, I strap a fake bomb onto my torso and pretend to be a suicide bomber. As a predictable result, a passerby reasonably though mistakenly believes that I pose a threat to the lives of others, and he reaches for his gun. I try to flee, but tripping over a gun that someone has carelessly left lying on the pavement, I fall to the ground. Finding the gun loaded, I realize that my survival depends on using it to kill the passerby in self-defense. (76)

The second part of his foundations discussion usually has Draper giving an account of what should be done in accordance with a position that he opposes. Thus, a not-so-smart utilitarian might say "Of course Rescuer should push the fat man off the bridge. It is better not to allow five lives to end because Rescuer has an aversion to pushing people around."

The third part has Draper presenting his own views. This brings rights-talk into the picture. Now we are told that pushing Victim, the fat man, infringes (or violates) his right to self-ownership (Draper's terminology). The implication is that infringing a right is not just an everyday wrong. Rather, it a heavyweight when it comes to making normative claims. In the third part of his foundations enterprise, we are also told that it is presumptively important that the resolution to our problem posed by our story should be in accord with our common moral intuitions.

The lengthy foundations portion of the book covers such topics as what are the most basic rights (Chapter 2), what sorts of harmful actions infringe upon our rights, what sort of conditions allow individuals and/or groups to maintain their right to self defense, and when is it or is it not allowed to harm innocent bystanders. The way Draper lays out this foundations process is not only lengthy, it is also very systematic and precise.

Finally, by Chapter 8, Draper is ready to talk to us about war by asking "What justifies recourse to war?" (169) Roughly, this is the same as asking "Does war bring about more (or less) unjust harm?" The principle that answers this question is as follows.

The justifiable war principle: Recourse to war is justified if (i) for any available alternative to war that would inflict as much or more unjust harm, the overall consequences of choosing war would be at least as good as the overall consequences of choosing that alternative, and (ii) for any available alternative to war that would inflict less unjust harm, the disadvantage, in terms of inflicting more unjust harm, of choosing war rather than that alternative is far outweighed by the overall advantage of choosing war rather than that alternative. (170)

Several points about this principle. [1] In contrast to traditional just war theory that talks about all forms of harm, Draper counts only unjust harm in figuring whether nations or non-nation groups should go to war. The fact that millions of soldiers on the unjust side will die in a war is not included (or triggers less concern) in the calculus that helps us decide if that war is just. [2] When Draper talks about harm, he means harm to the rights of the just warriors and innocent participants in war. So although his principle sounds utilitarian, he treats it as if it is basically deontological (in that he counts the loss of rights rather than interests in any decision that leads to war or peace). [3] He assumes that it is a doable task to compare rights when they are in conflict with one another. Whether it is or not is not much discussed in this volume. (170-171) Perhaps it is a topic he will discuss more fully when he presents us with a work that gives us the complete picture of just war theory from the viewpoint of individual rights. [4] He makes it clear that his principle implies many of the principles of traditional just war theory (e.g., last resort, the benefits of war must be proportionate, etc.). Evidently, because his principle is more compact, and in some sense simpler, it is judged to be better. (178)

So Draper's (single, but two-part) justifiable war principle is his main contribution to the justice of the war (jus ad bellum) portion of just war theory. There remains for him to say something about the justice in the war (jus in bello) portion. He does so, at least in part, with the following principle.

The defense liability principle: If (1) an individual x poses a threat of unjust harm to a second individual y (i.e., x behaves in such a way that, barring preventive action, x will infringe upon y's non-contractual rights and thereby jeopardize interests protected by those rights), or x belongs to a group g that poses such a threat, and (2) x is more responsible than y for that threat, then (3) (ceteris paribus) it would not infringe upon x's rights to eliminate or reduce the threat by inflicting necessary and proportionate harm on x. (83)

After Draper cites some other (less important) principles, and a host of distinctions, he makes it clear that he is on the way to developing a full-fledged, sophisticated and plausible just war theory of individual rights.

But he seeks more than plausibility for his (potential) theory. After all, plausibility is a virtue that more than one theory might share. He wants to say that there is something special about (his) individual rights theory.

Well, is such a theory special? First, one must keep in mind that ethical theories speak to a different kind of population than do scientific theories. The latter speak primarily to specialists. Because they do, they can become specialized and technical and still be understood. Ethical theories speak to ordinary people and to their leaders, neither of which are specialists in ethics. Unfortunately, the direction Draper's theorizing is taking will most likely make just war theory less rather than more useful. It will show up in language that talks primarily to lawyers and professional philosophers rather than the people who need to use it.

Second, it is not clear that rights-talk can cover the whole waterfront in the theorizing process. Such talk has a place in our ethical thinking just as does talk of duty, obligation, good and bad consequences, etc. do. More than likely, this means that to feature rights-talk over these other ways of talking is a mistake. Why should assessing the morality of war focus on 'unjust (rights deprivation) harm' rather than the more general concept of 'harm?' If we run into a war situation where both sides are acting (equally) unjustly, won't we have to deemphasize the importance of rights-talk and revert to talking about harm as classical just war theory does?

Third, many of Draper's principles, dressed in a rights uniform, are reflections of what is found in just war theory. Some, of course, are not. But what just war theory tells us is too much like what Draper tells us. To suppose that there is something new and special going on here is stretching it a bit.

On a personal and final note. Draper leaves me with an impression caused by the rather strict conditions imposed on just war theory when it is married to rights. The impression is that we have here an author with a pacifist heart, but a brain of a just war theorist.