War and Moral Dissonance

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Peter A. French, War and Moral Dissonance, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 343pp., $30.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521169035.

Reviewed by James L. Cook, US Air Force Academy


It's easier to say what Peter French's new book is not than to say what it is. It's not a systematic treatment of the ethics of war in general à la Michael Walzer or Brian Orend, though at least one of the blurbs on the back cover might lead one to think otherwise. Neither is it a record of America's early twenty-first-century wars in the vein of Tom Ricks or Seth Jones -- historical accounts with moral overtones. Nor is it a collection of individual battlefield experiences. Instead, French offers an introductory memoir of classroom experiences followed by a series of meditations that bear little thematic unity but share a common genesis: the issues French considers all emerged as philosophically interesting problems during a series of ethics lessons he helped teach in the early years of the wars in Iraq and Afghanistan.

The first chapter -- French's classroom memoir -- is the book's longest and merits special attention as the lone anchor for the remaining chapters. We learn that in 2004 French and several other college professors became subcontractors to the US Navy. Their mission was "to acquaint [sea service chaplains] with various virtue concepts and character development issues and to help them deal with moral conflicts and the ethical education of the troops during their deployments in the combat zones in Iraq and Afghanistan" (2). War and Moral Dissonance is "the result of my responding to the philosophical provocations the experience produced" (ix).

Readers unfamiliar with the US military might find it surprising that ordained chaplains would require special help with "virtue concepts." French reminds uninitiated readers that chaplains are charged with moral education in garrison and in the field. That's a stiff challenge considering attitudes common in some military units. French notes that according to "a Pentagon report on the ethics of the troops in Iraq … only 38 percent of the Marines serving in country believe that noncombatants (Iraqi civilians) are to be treated with dignity and respect" (225; cf. 2). Even if chaplains had no pedagogical duties, French implies they still might have benefitted from a dose of secular ethics. He points to an AP report that in the decade prior to the second Iraq war, Navy chaplains had "'a discipline rate'" of more than twenty times that of regular Naval officers (3). The Navy's remedy for its pockets of moral malaise was to contract with companies that would in turn hire professional ethicists such as French. First French and his fellow hired-gun ethicists would design a course to train the chaplains; next the Navy would "validate" the course by having a hand-picked cadre of chaplains take it as though for real under the watchful eyes of senior officers; and finally the pros, French included, would teach the approved course at various naval bases.

It proved to be a tough process. French describes occasional assaults on his academic freedom in the classroom during the validation phase: senior officers overseeing the beta test sometimes told him to stick to his PowerPoint and avoid broaching certain sensitive topics. When French asked his class "if they knew what the mission is in Iraq," some opined that "'There is no mission in Iraq. We are just there,'" while others speculated that the mission was humanitarian or else that

it was always about oil and the sooner we admit that to ourselves, the easier it will be to get over it. Later, an admiral told me not to ask that question again. Consequently, I could not restrain myself from asking it at the other two [professional development training courses] I taught that spring (31).

Self-perceptions and idiosyncratic theologies further complicated the professor-student-overseer dynamic in French's classrooms. Chaplains of different confessions sometimes indulged petty rivalries. Some chaplains showed a disinterest in jus ad bellum bordering on nihilism. Throughout the beta test and the real courses a constant tension existed between the spiritual role chaplains must play as religious leaders and the military function they must fulfill as officers. French adopts the chaplains' own metaphor for this tension as the title of his first chapter, "The Two-Collar Conflict." The phrase alludes to the fact that naval chaplains wear their rank insignia on one side of their collar and the designation of their religious denomination on the other side. At times the tension generated by serving two masters almost literally has the chaplains by the throat.

Against that backdrop French begins his meditations, which one might group into general categories. The first comprises meditations that don't reach definite conclusions or jibe easily with mainstream discussions of the just-war tradition. French takes up an issue raised by the chaplains, attacks it with great energy, leaves a rubble of unanswered questions around the work site, and then moves on.

Consider the second chapter, for example. "Our Better Angels Have Broken Wings" is the sort of reflection that tends not to appear these days in mainstream, secular books on the just-war tradition. Most such treatments of just-war issues simply assume that morally flawed human beings engage in war and delve no deeper into the psychology of wrongdoing; instead the focus is on the constraints necessary to make war as moral as it can be. French's second chapter, by contrast, deals with evil in war as much earlier thinkers -- Augustine, say, in Contra Faustum XXII.74 -- might have done. French feels compelled to construct a taxonomy of evils before inquiring what a just-war schema should set as priorities. Although he's careful not to state what he can't prove, French suspects that a species can be rational without being "inherently good" (71).

It's a little hard to discern how that suspicion would cash out in the war room or on the battlefield. Presumably the upshot might be that a chaplain charged with moral education, not to mention a unit commander who's ultimately responsible for whatever her soldiers do in the field, must use negative reinforcement rather than appeal to humanity's (and the chapter title's) "better angels." That would be a relatively optimistic entailment of French's homo-homini-lupus worries. A much darker conclusion would be possible: if it were really true that "constraining one's straightforward maximization (constraining self-love and self-referential altruism) cannot be rationally justified" (71), as French insists, and if we assumed that everyone in the military chain of command from the US president down to the lowliest grunt in the field were rational and self-interested, then the just-war tradition might be an elaborate sham in which an egoist alpha male (to continue French's wolf analogy) at 1600 Pennsylvania Avenue or 10 Downing Street simply rationalizes whatever gratifies him. French doesn't explicitly address this possibility. It would amount to substituting a brand of nihilism for a millennia-old moral tradition. But surely he must have considered it, and one would love to know more about his thinking on that point.

So the questions left hovering at the end of the second chapter won't get an answer in the third or subsequent chapters. Chapter 3, "Responsibility for Innocence Lost," another of the dangling-question chapters, opens a new issue. When we think of any sort of education, including the moral education that US naval chaplains are supposed to offer to military units, we probably have in mind a process with goals benevolent and salutary through and through. But French reminds us that moral education requires us to confront evil, and each student of ethics will have a first-time encounter with real evil in the real world, not just a theoretical evil in the classroom. For that reason, French suggests, we need to think seriously about how we justify the role of moral educator: "My claim that innocence must be lost by learning of evil not only by description but also by acquaintance suggests to some that I am treading a very fine line between ushering a child into moral responsibility and child abuse" (88). Moreover, "Philosophers are not well suited by training to offer much useful advice regarding the threshold of evil at which trauma supplants knowledge acquisition" (90).

By analogy French points us toward a very serious problem that applies to soldiers as much as to children: right conduct in war presupposes some knowledge of good and evil. But how does an older generation introduce a younger to that evil, not just "by description" but "by acquaintance," especially when there's no obvious way to simulate the overwhelming evil troops will face in combat zones? French doesn't offer a formulaic answer to the question except to say that children need to understand just how bad the world is. In this the chapter reminds one of Plato's Socrates and his critique of "imitative poetry" in Republic: the educator's goal must be to break down rather than build up illusions even if a fantasy world is less frightening than the real one that children and soldiers eventually must confront. And that's where French ends the meditation: societies are to prepare their soldiers for battlefield horrors by being truthful. That sounds right, but what wouldn't one give to have the discussion continue with a detailed description of educational topics and methods in the next chapter?

Alas, a new meditation must begin. The pattern of reflection in Chapter 4 falls into a second category: some of French's meditations prefer one conclusion over its rivals but don't demonstrate that the preferred conclusion is the most logical. The subject of Chapter 4, "Virtuous Responses to Moral Evil," is forgiveness. French focuses on a real-life holocaust story told by Elie Wiesel that tests the limits of forgiveness. Under what circumstance ought one forgive? This question could be turned into a reflection on just-war principles -- of the last resort criterion, for instance -- but French prefers to keep the discussion focused on the individual moral agent. The argument is interesting but sometimes dismisses possibilities with little justification. French writes: "I do not see how forgiveness could be morally virtuous if it is done for selfish reasons such as allowing one to sleep better at nights [sic] or to promote one's mental health" (108). It's hard to imagine a pre-Christian or Christian ethicist so worried about avoiding selfishness if what's meant is merely gratification. An aretaic approach to ethics, for example, need not mire itself in debates over selfish versus altruistic motives; gratification is fine as long as it's proper gratification, that is, gratification resulting in the right degree from the right cause at the right time. Likewise, many a Christian ethicist wouldn't begrudge a kind of gratification, even amounting to ecstasy, to those who conform to Divine will. Nor does French, perhaps, so long as gratification is not the primary motivation for forgiveness. But oddly, when he justifies refusal to forgive he uses language that doesn't shut the door on what might be just another brand of gratification -- satisfaction that pure, merciless justice has been done. The result is that his definitive conclusion seems less than logically necessary. Still, it's a marvelously thought-provoking chapter.

Chapter 7, "Torture," exemplifies a third category of meditation. It reaches a definite conclusion, and the logic is solid given a few reasonable suppressed premises. But one wonders at the omissions. Here French's use of Frankfurt's "second-order volition" concept breaks interesting new ground. It's surprising, however, that French focuses almost exclusively on the harm torture wreaks on its ostensible victims; there's precious little said about how torture degrades its individual and collective practitioners. In the chapter's second paragraph, French describes a young military interrogator who committed suicide, apparently as the result of participating in "enhanced interrogation" sessions. "The torturer as victim of torture!" French summarizes (157). But then we hear little more on this point until eleven pages later, and then only a brief aside (168). It stands to reason that chaplains as moral educators in their military units would have been interested in the concept of torturer as victim.

There are a number of chapters that argue vociferously for points that many would accept on less elaborate foundations than French constructs. Chapter 10, "Inference Gaps in Moral Assessment: Individuals, Organizations, and Institutions," builds an argument on the concept of "institution" as though the term were used univocally throughout the chapter. Eventually French draws a general conclusion that manifests itself in this way:

If the Marine unit is operating unjustly, it does not follow that any member of the unit is acting unjustly even when following orders, and it does not follow that the organization, the Marines or the Marine unit, is acting unjustly, even if the war in which it is acting is unjust or the institution of which it is a concrete embodiment is unjust. (224)

Chapter 12, "The Moral Challenge of Collective Memories," works very hard to conclude that the culturally-instilled prejudices French calls "collective memories" -- the Serbian recollection of defeat at the Field of Blackbirds in 1389 and victimization afterward, for example -- don't excuse wrongdoing. Such prejudices do present a challenge to the moral actor, however. Similarly, Chapter 13, "Corporate Responsibility and Punishment Redux," eventually concludes that a company is guilty of wrongdoing when its work is shoddy according to industry standards modulated by factors of working environment and results in death or injury to the client. More concretely, KBR is responsible if soldiers are electrocuted in structures erected under DoD contract. It's not that the buttressing arguments in these chapters lack interest; on the contrary, French's ruminations are always worthwhile even if they're not paradigms of parsimony. It's simply that many readers will require much less argument than French offers.

The fourteenth and final chapter, "Mission Creep," is nearly as long as the first. French indulges in a moment or two of hyperbole, as when he opines that "Our [US] shared stories are not those that sustain Athenian-style democracy. They are what [Michael] Sandel calls the 'vacant, vicarious fare of confessional talk shows, celebrity scandals, and sensational trials'" (332). And there's nothing particularly new in French's conclusion that the present war in Iraq commenced in a way that violated the just-war tradition. But the chapter raises an especially timely question as the US tries to extricate itself from two attempts at nation-building that happened also to be wars and in the wake of the Arab Spring: what are the prerequisites for different kinds of democracy? French's emphasis on a common narrative as a necessary condition for a certain kind of democracy to work seems as chastening as it is logical. Diverse populations with no strong desire to merge can indeed be put within national boundaries -- one thinks of Tito's Yugoslavia or of the Habsburg Mehrvölkerstaat and any number of other empires -- but the result won't be a democracy or even a potential democracy.

Paradoxically, the most unusual chapter provides the best clue as to how the book will fit into the huge just-war literature generated by Operation Iraqi Freedom and Operation Enduring Freedom. In Chapter 8, "Community and Worthwhile Living in Second Life," French analyzes the real-life case of a badly injured veteran who spends much of his time in a virtual "translife." French asks,

Should we be willing to grant that Bob [a disfigured Marine who had lost the use of both legs and one arm], who shows no signs of depression during his time as a resident of Second Life, is now living a meaningful, albeit an illusionary, life by manipulating his female avatar through a variety of three-dimensional virtual experiences? (179)

French's treatment of the case is philosophically rigorous, relying heavily on Frankfurt, but also poetically touching. That French asks the question, not how he answers it, indicates what sort of book War and Moral Dissonance is: it's very much a late- or post-war book. It still worries about ad bellum and in bello ethical lapses, but French delves deeper, into the metaphysics of those errors, in a way that's tougher for pre-, early-, and mid-war ethicists to do. They're busy with the exigencies of the ethical moment -- convincing whoever will listen that we shouldn't go to war, or that we went to war for the wrong reasons and need to get out now, or that we need to fight differently than we're fighting. French contributes to those debates, but Chapter 8 shows he's able to look deeply into war's aftermath and ask troubling but necessary questions. This is French's writing at its impressive best, a sui generis chapter that combines philosophical acumen with profound empathy for a single victim of war.