War and Self-Defense

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David Rodin, War and Self-Defense, Oxford University Press, 2003, 213pp, $27.50 (hbk), ISBN 0-19-92741-6

Reviewed by Gerald Lang, St Catherine's College, Oxford


The conviction that it is permissible for an individual to engage in violent self-defensive action against attack is securely entrenched in our ordinary moral thought. Also widely entrenched is the conviction that warfare is permissible, at least in circumstances in which states are under attack. Wars of national-defense are, in fact, the only wars that may be fought without explicit authorisation by the United Nations, as Article 51 of the United Nations Charter makes clear. Furthermore, it is widely thought that these issues are linked: the permissibility of wars of national-defense is reckoned to be a function of, or at least analogous to, the permissibility of personal self-defense. David Rodin remarks, not implausibly, that the notion of national-defense "gains enormous intuitive legitimacy from the analogy with personal self-defense" (p. 107).

In this book, Rodin subjects these connections to detailed and skilful examination, and concludes that they are insufficiently substantial to do the work that is required of them: for him, there is no usable analogy between personal self-defense and national self-defense. Rodin then goes on to sketch a normative picture of legitimate warfare that would require the creation of a universal state, consisting in, at the very least, "the establishment of a world monopoly of military force together with a minimal judicial mechanism for the resolution of international and internal disputes" (p. 187). Such a minimal universal state would be justified in authorising military action as a means of enforcing international law.

Though I suspect that Rodin underestimates the robustness of the connections between personal self-defense and national-defense, it should be said immediately that his book will be required reading for anyone with a reflective interest in these issues. It is clearly and shrewdly argued throughout, insightful, provocative, and elegantly written.

The book falls into two parts. In Part I, Rodin examines the nature of personal self-defense. In Part II, he considers whether the account of personal self-defense that has emerged in Part I can be used to support an account of legitimate warfare. I shall consider these two parts in turn.

Rodin analyses personal self-defense in rights-based terms, using some theoretical apparatus made familiar by the legal theorist Wesley Hohfeld. In Rodin's account, the right to personal self-defense emerges as a liberty, or permission--which is to say, a justification, rather than merely an excuse--to commit homicide in the defense of life (pp. 31, 33). The right of self-defense possesses the in-built limitations of necessity, imminence, and proportionality. In Rodin's Hohfeldian analysis, the right of self-defense is a relational one: it is triggered by certain sorts of disturbance in a normatively charged relationship that holds between the subject of the right (the victim) and the object of the right (the attacker). Most of Rodin's attention in these pages is devoted to an analysis of the conditions that have to be met in order for the victim's self-defensive right to be activated, or alternatively, for the attacker's right to be forfeited. (As Rodin clearly explains, these are simply different sides of the same coin.) This is energy well spent, for one immediate puzzle for the justifiability of self-defensive action is that, at the moment of potentially lethal engagement between the victim and the attacker, the threat between them is entirely symmetrical: either the victim is going to kill the attacker, or the attacker is going to kill the victim. They are, by assumption, locked into a life-and-death struggle. And both, by assumption, ordinarily possess the right to life. But few would wish to say that the right of self-defensive action is enjoyed by the attacker, as well as by the victim. Most think that the right to engage in violent self-defence is asymmetrical; it is a right possessed by the victim, but not by the attacker. It is natural to conclude that the asymmetry between attacker and victim must be some sort of function of the attacker's responsibility for the life-or-death struggle that has arisen between them.

If we appeal to merely causal responsibility, however, that asymmetry begins to look distinctly precarious. Though the attacker may be causally responsible for initiating the life-and-death encounter between him and the victim, the victim, no less than the attacker, is causally responsible for helping to maintain the existence of that life-and-death encounter. It is natural to conclude that, in order to maintain the right sort of distance between them, the sort of responsibility holding between the attacker and the victim that we are trying to capture has to be more than merely causal; it must have a thicker character, which more adequately displays the moral asymmetry between them.

Rodin argues that what fuels the right of the victim to engage in self-defensive violent action is that the attacker is at fault for attacking the victim. By culpably attacking the victim, the attacker disturbs the normative relationship existing between them, and therefore forfeits his right not to be attacked. But this means, in turn, that certain types of attacker cannot be permissibly counter-attacked. The protected class of attackers include both 'innocent threats' and 'innocent attackers'. Innocent threats are agents whose dangerousness to the victim is not explained by any exercise of agency at all. (The standard example is that of a fat man who is falling through the air towards the victim.) Innocent attackers are attackers whose agency is in some sense compromised or impaired at the time of attack on the victim. Innocent attackers form a fairly diverse class. They include agents who are impaired as a result of hypnosis, ignorance, insanity, infancy, and duress. Due to the impairment of their agency, Rodin holds that these types of attacker do not enjoy a sufficiently robust normative relationship to the victim for them to forfeit their immunity.

Actually, Rodin takes a slightly more nuanced view than this: innocent threats are immune to attack, on his view, but only certain sorts of innocent attackers are also immune to defensive attack. These are the agents whose attitude to the victim does not reflect their psychological dispositions. Other types of innocent attacker--those who are acting under duress, say--are not immune to attack. Given his commitment to the central importance of fault, Rodin struggles a little to draw the appropriate lines between innocent attackers who enjoy immunity and innocent attackers who do not (see pp. 90-99--to his credit, though, he does not attempt to conceal the difficulties). The problem is that the innocent attackers earmarked for defensive attack are clearly not morally responsible for the lethal threat they pose to the victim. What seems to matter to Rodin, when all is said and done, is that the attacker manifests some hostile intentional attitude to the victim in his attack, regardless of whether he is responsible for that attitude.

Now many writers, such as Judith Thomson, take the view that the victim may permissibly attack innocent threats and innocent attackers, as well as culpable attackers. She argues that, although they may not be responsible for their attack, innocent attackers and innocent threats nonetheless lack the right to attack the victim, and may therefore be counter-attacked. Rodin's reply to Thomson is that exactly the same could be said about a stone that is about to fall on top of the victim (pp. 85-6). A stone also lacks the right to attack the victim. And this supposedly leads to an embarrassment for Thomson: her strategy of allowing the conditions under which rights are violated from the conditions under which agency is manifested inadvertently apparently allows stones, and other inanimate objects, to be classified as rights-violators.

I don't think this can be right, however. It's true that falling stones cannot violate the victim's rights. But Rodin would presumably also agree that stones lack the right not to be attacked. If the victim is in a position to destroy a stone hurtling towards him, he may unproblematically do so. Stones have no presence on the rights landscape at all, but innocent attackers and innocent threats possess rights which are retained through the agency-impaired episodes in which they are threatening the victim's life. Yet why should that be? If the lack of responsibility of innocent attackers and innocent threats is supposed to disable the claim that they are capable of violating the victim's right, why doesn't it disable the claim that they themselves possess the right not to be attacked by the victim? To put it another way, if the claim that innocent attackers and innocent threats can violate rights exposes Thomson to the taunt that stones can also violate the victim's rights, then the claim that innocent attackers and innocent threats possess the right not to be attacked by the victim would appear to expose Rodin to the taunt that stones also possess the right not to be attacked by the victim. Rodin is trying to have it both ways, but it isn't clear why the analogy that he has proposed between innocent threats and stones shouldn't be enforced at both levels--both in terms of violating rights, and in terms of retaining rights. Rodin provides a further response (p. 86, and pp. 88-9), according to which the innocent threat is, qua falling object, just like a stone. This 'qua-move' proves too much, however, since a fully culpable attacker, qua mobile and potentially deadly material object, may also be just like a stone.

The sensible thing to do here is simply to restrict the constituency of rights-violators to the constituency of individuals who have a general capacity for agency, regardless of whether those individuals are currently exercising that capacity. That approach, which Rodin is tacitly relying upon, is of course also open to Thomson. Once we do that, it also seems possible to point to morally significant differences between victims and innocent attackers and innocent threats. For innocent attackers and threats initiate the attack on the victim, after all, and that is something that moral agents have no business in doing. (This fact about attackers and threats also allows them to be comfortably distinguished from the 'innocent bystander', who inadvertently blocks the victim's escape from the attack, but whom, according to most non-consequentialist writers, including Rodin, is immune from attack.) This 'initiation' criterion is further strengthened by a back-to-front worry in Rodin's characterisation of the appropriate normative relationship between subject and object. Rodin appears to invest all the normative significance in the object's intentional attitudes towards the subject, and in his consciously refraining from violating the subject's rights. That makes it seem as though the value of a rights-respecting relationship between person X and person Y is constituted by X's consciously refraining from interfering with Y, and by Y's consciously refraining from interfering with X. That arguably gets things the wrong way round: why X and Y ought to refrain from consciously interfering with each other's rights is explained by the value of a relationship between them in which their respective rights are mutually respected.

In Part II of the book, Rodin turns his attention to the various analogical possibilities on offer. I'll refer to these collectively as the 'defensive strategies'. The resulting taxonomy is fairly complicated (see the diagram on p. 125, which identifies eight possibilities), but the relevant options fall, roughly speaking, into two camps: the 'reductive' strategy, and the 'analogical' strategy. The reductive strategy characterises war as something like a composite set of individual acts of self-defense, whereas the analogical strategy gives super-personal, state actors a place in the analysis. As Rodin sensibly remarks (p.129), it is difficult to make sense of the ways in which wars are conducted unless we give an irreducible role to state actors, not just those individuals who happen to be affected by the prosecution of war. This consideration requires us to abandon a 'pure' reductive strategy, but it still permits a reductive description of the end of the right to go to war, which will be concerned with the preservation of those individual lives threatened by military attack. By contrast, the analogical strategy will characterise the end of the right to go to war as being concerned with the preservation of the state, and with the goods of political association. Let us consider these in turn.

Rodin identifies a number of problems with the reductive strategy. First, this strategy cannot accommodate the component of Just War Theory--its jus in bello component--that insists upon the justifiability of military action by soldiers on both sides of the conflict. This puts Just War Theory at odds with a theory of personal self-defense because, as we have seen, the theory of personal self-defense insists on a normative asymmetry between victims and attackers. Second, the reductive strategy will cut wars of national-defense and wars of humanitarian intervention from the same normative cloth, as both types of conflict are concerned with the saving of individual lives. This is problematic for Just War Theory, and for international law, as neither makes any unambiguous allowance for humanitarian intervention. Third, there is the 'argument from bloodless invasion', which points to the possibility of an invasion of a state's territory which is only conditionally threatening, or threatening only given armed resistance to it. Neither Just War Theory nor international law insist upon acquiescence to such an invasion, yet the theory of personal self-defense does not sanction a victim's lethal resistance to threats that are conditionally but not imminently lethal, since it insists upon a victim's duty to retreat, on pain of violation of the proportionality condition.

Rodin also argues that the analogical strategy is flawed. First, although the goods of political association, such as the goods of collective self-determination, are surely not convincingly realised by deeply oppressive regimes, Just War Theory and international law aim to protect every sovereign state from unauthorised aggression. Second, even if we were to insist that states must meet some condition of non-oppressiveness in order to warrant moral consideration, there would still be the problem of explaining why the invasion of one non-oppressive state by another non-oppressive state is objectionable. As Rodin sees matters, the analogical strategy is unable to capture the particularity of the value of the form of political association to the particular citizens encompassed by it, without succumbing to an unwelcome form of relativism about value.

One general problem with the trajectory of argument in this part of the book is that Rodin requires the defensive strategies to be tightly contoured to the existing content of Just War Theory and the international legal order that has been, to some extent, erected upon it. This requirement unduly narrows the prospects for the defensive strategies. It overlooks the possibility that the defensive strategies may make an important contribution to a revisionary account of war that is less reverential towards state boundaries, and that is more hospitable to humanitarian intervention. So, rather than dismissing the defensive strategies because of their failure to uphold the shibboleths of Just War Theory and international law, they might instead be retained and used to prompt revision in Just War Theory and international law.

To take an important example, and as Rodin himself demonstrates, the two components of Just War Theory--jus ad bellum and jus in bello--fail to meet up in a satisfactory manner. The basic problem can be put like this. According to jus ad bellum, only one side to a war, at most, can be credited with a just cause. But the jus in bello component insists on the justifiability of combat on both sides. This oddity isn't resolved by the reflection that soldiers on an unjust side are typically conscripted and ignorant, for such considerations would furnish them only with an excuse, not a full-blown justification. Given that the war is taking place, there are of course certain military operations by the unjust side that would compound the wrongness of their initial participation. But unjust combatants' moral accountability for the additional non-combatant atrocities they commit in the course of a war does not require that they be classified as just combatants in the first place. To think otherwise would be to argue in the following manner: if X is going to murder Y, X should murder Y gently; X is going to murder Y; so, X should murder Y gently; so, since X can't murder Y gently without murdering Y, X should murder Y. Needless to say, this conclusion is to be avoided at all costs!

Rodin's criticisms of the analogical strategy also seem unconvincing. While he argues that the goods realised by one non-oppressive state may be similar in kind to the goods realised by any other, he does not explain why a supposedly non-oppressive state would have any business in invading another non-oppressive state. Were any such invasion to take place, the citizens of the invaded state would surely have every reason for suspecting that the aims of the aggressive state were not benign, and that their basic security was at intolerable risk. The 'duty to retreat' invoked in the theory of personal self-defense seems irrelevant here: once a state has been invaded, there is, by assumption, nowhere for its citizens to retreat to.

One final remark. Rodin argues that his envisaged universal minimal state would have the authority--in virtue, chiefly, of its impartiality--to engage in war in order to enforce international law. But many of the problems he raises for the defensive strategies are likely to affect the viability of his own proposal. If bloodless invasion is to be preferred to bloody non-surrender, and if one form of non-oppressive political association is as good as any other, then why, exactly, would international law carry a provision for war, at least in cases not involving genocidal extermination? If there are good answers to this question, then it would seem that friends of the defensive strategies are straightforwardly entitled to take advantage of them